Justice and Health Care: Selected Essays

Placeholder book cover

Allen Buchanan, Justice and Health Care: Selected Essays, Oxford UP, 2009, 259pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195394061.

Reviewed by Jennifer Prah Ruger, Yale University


This volume comprises a collection of ten essays by Allen Buchanan, and in some cases Buchanan and co-authors as well, on various topics under the general rubric of justice and health care. The essays were originally published over the span of some twenty-four years in various publication venues including edited books and journals in bioethics, public affairs, and law and policy. As Buchanan notes, the selected essays do not comprise an overall theory of justice and health care or justice and health, and indeed a major motivation of this effort is to project a deep skepticism about the very task of attempting to put forth such a theory, which Buchanan eschews as too ambitious. He offers instead a more "modest" "thought-journey" to gain "a deeper appreciation of the complexities of thinking systematically, self-critically, and realistically about justice in health care".

While the essays are not arranged in chronological order, there is a rhythm to the sequence, commencing with a 1984 article on the right to a decent minimum of health care and moving through a series of discussions about the respective responsibilities of the private and public sectors in health care, issues raised and responses to questions of rationing more broadly and specifically in the context of managed care organizations and for-profit entities, along with some deep reflection on the idea of trust and what we can and should expect from the medical profession in these and other settings. The selection ends with a return to questions about the right to health, what we can and cannot say about its content and specification and which institutions are relevant for its realization. The volume concludes with a wide ranging discussion of responsibility for global health with a particular emphasis on the notion of unprincipled "duty dumping" in our expectations about who owes what to whom on a global scale. I shall return to these essays in turn below.

In the first chapter, "The Right to a Decent Minimum of Health Care", Buchanan offers one of the most incisive and effective criticisms of attempts over the years to apply a utilitarian and especially a Rawlsian perspective (through use of the difference principle, and greatest equal liberty and equality of opportunity arguments) to the questions of justice in health care and in health. After reading the essay, one might reflect that Rawls's reluctance to take on this task himself may have, or should have, offered a harbinger of critiques to come, which Buchanan encompasses well within the pages of this chapter. Buchanan is utterly unconvinced by efforts to ground a right to health care in Rawls's principle of equality of opportunity and carefully and diligently sheds light on the circularity, ambiguity, lack of universality, and insensitivity to resource constraints that hinder the view's ability to provide a foundation, grounding, or "basis" "for an account of just health care." Despite the force of Buchanan's criticism, and the time with which it has had to sink into the modern architecture in bioethics, it's a bit surprising that it isn't taken up more often in efforts to recognize the lack of traction of the Rawlsian approach for health and health care. This essay should be both the start and end point of any understanding of the Rawlsian line of thinking applied to health and health care.

Efforts to cobble together a "pluralistic" justification for health care and public health rights -- through, for example, principles of rectification, compensation, exceptional sacrifice, harm, equal protection, productivity, fitness, prudence, coordination, and enforced beneficence -- discussed in this chapter, however, are unpersuasive and fail to get us to a coherent story of how we might justify health rights in a universal capacity. Just to take two concepts, public goods and coordination, public goods are brought up as a possible justification and coordination is held up as important. No one would argue that these two ideas are key elements to an overarching framework of justice and health care. The coordination argument alone, however, appears particularly vacuous given a lack of justification or discussion of what the coordination is for; coordination, of course, requires an objective, an end goal, to which activities are aimed. Moreover, if we rely on public goods arguments, we must have some reason to believe that public goods are worthy of public and individual investment, for example, in terms of a moral theory of a right to health or some other such notion. On this score, the chapter finds affinity with the libertarian persuasion arguing for no plausible justification for a right to health care or public health and certainly no right to health more broadly.

The bulk of chapter two, "Health-Care Delivery and Resource Allocation" rehearses the same themes as chapter one, particularly focusing on critiques of various approaches to justifying a right to health care, predominately a decent minimum, but in greater detail than done in the first essay. An interesting elaboration on this set of arguments is a discussion in this chapter on the view adopted by the President's Commission in 1983, which espoused a "social obligation to provide an adequate level (or decent minimum) of care for all". However, the notion that some ethical theory of a moral right to health care would justify this perspective fails to emerge, leaving one wanting for decisiveness regarding a balance among rival theories of justice. The remainder of chapter two and chapter six, "Managed Care: Rationing Without Justice, But Not Unjustly" then move on to take up the issues of rationing and resource allocation. The main point of chapter two is to argue for the need to ration and the need for systematic theorizing about allocating resources, which Buchanan argues is seriously lacking. A tour of two dichotomous approaches to resource allocation -- ethical and efficiency -- are presented in somewhat rudimentary form. What's clear in the review is a call for more systematic thinking about how to combine these approaches in efforts to come up with an alternative approach. Moreover, emphasis is placed on how little work has been done in the sub-domain of ethical theorizing about distributive justice and what is needed is the hard work of moving from abstract principles to practical policy solutions. A clarion call for such theoretical and policy analysis comes through loud and clear throughout this chapter.

Chapter six can be clumped with chapter two in terms of its focus on this general class of rationing issues, but the former takes a much more narrow approach by focusing specifically on managed care organizations and their respective roles in the rationing of health care. An important distinction is made in this chapter. That is the difference between, on the one hand, the justness or unjustness of rationing by managed care organizations within the broader scope of the health care system at large (for which Buchanan answers that managed care organizations are justified in acting competitively even if they deny some access to care) and, on the other hand, the justness or unjustness of rationing by managed care organizations in terms of the populations with which they are in contractual relationships to serve (for which Buchanan answers that managed care organizations need to be put to the test primarily of contractual or procedural justice in order to know whether or not they act unjustly). The criterion of substantive justice could plausibly apply to assessing the actions of managed care organizations, but because throughout history a broader standard on substantive justice has failed to exist in the U.S., this criterion rests on shifting ground.

A common theme in chapters three, "Public and Private Responsibilities in the U.S. Health-Care System", four, "Privatization and Just Health Care", and five, "Ethical Issues in For-Profit Health Care" centers around the question of the morality of actions by private and for-profit institutions in the health care system and what criteria one might draw on to evaluate moral and immoral behavior by these institutions. An important point is made about "duty dumping" (although this term is not used until the last chapter in the book), which involves allocating obligations to institutions and individuals without offering an adequate justification for doing so. While this concept is employed later in the book in chapter ten, the underlying notion is relevant in the analysis of the role of private entities in health care. Buchanan is particularly concerned with the unintended consequences of "duty dumping", which involve false and unrealistic expectations on certain actors (e.g., private for-profit hospitals) at the expense of failing to hold others (e.g., all citizens or the government) responsible for addressing morally urgent issues (e.g., lack of access to health care). Rather, for-profit institutions are no more responsible than are we all for major problems in health care, such as lack of access to the system by some individuals and populations. Such actors are simply pursuing their own interests in the absence of an ethical assignment and accountability enforcement mechanism about health care in the United States. On the flipside, those who advocate more privatization in the health care system put forth incomplete reasoning, Buchanan argues, because privatization must be assessed in the context of multiple factors. These factors could include the fair and effective distribution of costs, resource allocation, and financing, not just whether or not private institutions can produce or do more at lower cost or offer more options and choice for consumers.

The next two chapters -- chapter seven, "Trust in Managed Care Organizations" and chapter eight, "Is There a Medical Profession in the House?" -- concentrate on the issue of trust. While the well-trodden territory of legitimacy in managed care organizations (e.g., criteria such as nondiscrimination, impartiality, publicity of rules, publicity of justification for rules, and denial procedures) and conflicts of interest are rehearsed here, a more refreshing distinction is presented in the difference between "status trust" and "merit trust". Physicians, for example, benefit from "status trust" just by virtue of being part of a profession of physicians, a profession about which Buchanan is highly critical. He is especially concerned about the medical profession's failure to present convincing evidence justifying its special status. He offers much discussion about this special status, arguing that the medical profession is privileged by a norm enabling a nearly completely hands-off culture when it comes to oversight of physicians and their practices in American medicine. Buchanan notes that in America the medical profession and physicians specifically enjoy circumstances of virtually no external regulation and that medical professionals and their associates benefit significantly from substantial financial compensation. By contrast "individually merited trust" is based not on membership in a club but on evidence of high quality conduct or performance. Buchanan urges us to critically examine the difference between "status trust" and "merit trust" in our evaluation of the medical profession. He warns also against using unimportant criteria (e.g., whether a physician is nice or has a good bedside manner) for assessing standards in "trust". The significant criticism pitched at the medical profession in this book is worth considering in reevaluating whether the social benefits outweigh the social costs of this socially constructed and highly unequal relationship between the medical profession and the rest of society.

Chapter nine returns to the issues brought up in chapter one on the right to health and health care, but chapter ten, "Responsibility for Global Health" (again written in conjunction with a co-author), really tackles the issue of "duty dumping" referred to earlier. The chapter urges caution against "duty dumping" and calls this practice unprincipled and politically expedient. "Duty dumping" also reveals a publicly popular trend, which involves blaming certain entities in entirety or for all global health problems. Good reasons for assigning such responsibility are lacking in these efforts. Moreover, we should be wary of expeditious attempts to too hastily adopt the "can implies ought" principle in assigning and assessing responsibility. As in earlier chapters, a helpful example is brought to the fore; employing a grocery store owner or merchant as the actor to illustrate the point. The example is one in which "duty dumping" is applied to the grocer or, by extension, to food suppliers more broadly. The argument is made that grocers or food corporations (e.g., Kraft Foods, Inc.) have no greater moral duty to feed people who are hungry than do we all. An entity may very well be in the business of producing or selling a certain product or service that people need. This characteristic does not, however, offer a justification for attaching to that entity a moral responsibility for providing said product or service to people free of charge or at a cost that customers can afford. This practice could significantly affect the "bottom line' of these businesses and might even threaten their very existence. Profits or returns to shareholders aside, moral reasoning of this persuasion is faulty, this chapter argues.

Another example that is brought up to illuminate "duty dumping" is the blaming and finger pointing that is typically directed toward pharmaceutical companies that make medicines that people need (e.g., drugs for AIDS). Again, the chapter argues that these companies are not responsible for providing such drugs to people who need them at a price that people can afford. Again, this constitutes "duty dumping". Responsibility assignment is not only misplaced in these cases, but the practice of "duty dumping" diverts attention from responsibility assignment to the real duty bearer -- all of us -- to do what we can to form and hold accountable institutions to address these concerns. The strong attack on "duty dumping" presented in this chapter is quite useful in disputing such lines of reasoning. As with other aspects of the book, however, this chapter fails then to provide a coherent theorized moral vision for the allocation of moral responsibility to global and national state and non-state actors. Moreover, it is thin on acknowledging other efforts to take on this endeavor, such as the idea of "provincial globalism," which presents a moral vision for global health and substantive and procedural aspects of moral allocation of responsibility for addressing global health externalities and inequalities.

Overall, Justice and Health Care provides an interesting discussion of a wide array of issues pertaining to justice and health care. The book is unapologetic about the absence of an overall theory or coherent framework for addressing justice and health care or justice in health. Nor does it include analysis of other major endeavors to do so, such as those found, for example, in The Ends of Human Life,[1] Just Health,[2] Health and Social Justice,[3] and Social Justice: The Moral Foundations of Public Health and Health Policy.[4] Still, the book takes on a number of important issues and offers some useful and helpful work, especially cautioning against uncritically accepting certain faulty and misguided assumptions, criteria, and lines of reasoning found in thinking about justice and health care.

[1] Ezekiel J. Emanuel, The Ends of Human Life: Medical Ethics in a Liberal Polity (Harvard UP, 1998).

[2] Norman Daniels, Just Health: Meeting Health Needs Fairly (Cambridge UP, 2007).

[3] Jennifer Prah Ruger, Health and Social Justice (Oxford UP, 2010).

[4] Madison Powers and Ruth Faden, Social Justice: The Moral Foundations of Health Care and Health Policy (Oxford UP, 2008).