Justice Back and Forth: Duties to the Past and Future

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Richard Vernon, Justice Back and Forth: Duties to the Past and Future, University of Toronto Press, 2016, 274pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781487500245.

Reviewed by W. James Booth, Vanderbilt University


Richard Vernon offers a sweeping survey of issues related to what he terms "temporal justice." That survey is not steered by a clear argumentative path linking its varied elements, and thus it is perhaps best approached as a collection of more or less independent reflections on the ways in which time inflects our doing justice.

Vernon divides the "temporality" of justice into "historic redress" and a future-oriented dimension which he terms "intergenerational justice." This neatly divides the book into two clusters of chapters having little in common apart from one being directed to the past, the other to the future.

The past-oriented grouping of essays Vernon titles "Looking Back," a passive almost aesthetic relationship to past time, standing in clear contrast to the "Going Forth" name given to the essays dealing with justice to the future. "Looking Back" suggests that there is no possibility of doing justice to the past, but only possible present and future uses to be made of it, and something like that is indeed the overarching conclusion of this book. Issues addressed in the essays of Part I include anachronism in making normative judgements about the past, collective (inter-temporal) guilt, restitution, and memory. Each essay provides a useful survey of the issue it is addressing, and a précis of some of the more influential scholarship addressing it. However, the complexity of these questions of temporality and justice, and in some cases the large literatures around them, mean that this survey format, while helpful, is not always adequate to the challenges that drive these essays.

Consider for example the discussion of collective guilt across time developed in Chapter 2. The motivating question here is a longstanding one, extending back to Aristotle's Politics: what is the forensic identity of political communities across time? Taking the form of an engagement with Karl Jasper's celebrated essay, The Question of German Guilt, this chapter offers an argument for civic (institutional) rather than national identity as the ground of enduring responsibility. This familiar approach is itself vulnerable to criticism, and indeed in typical cases where this question of identity emerges, the argument presented in this chapter seems unable to do the needed theoretical work. Questions of continuity arise typically as conundrums where there has been wholesale institutional rupture: e.g., the defeat of the Nazi state in 1945 and four years later the emergence of German liberal-democratic and communist states; the collapse of the Vichy regime and the reestablishment of the Republic in France. On the civic identity theory, citizens of the erstwhile Federal Republic of Germany have no responsibility-creating continuity with the Nazi regime. Of course this does not mean that a national-cultural understanding of identity is viable, and Vernon convincingly sets out some of its vulnerabilities. Still, a full engagement with these issues would have yielded a richer account of identity, change and responsibility for past injustice.

The second half, "Going Forth," consists of five essays on justice and future persons. Issues addressed here include future autonomy rights, the survival of communities and its impact on future generations, and unfair burdens arising from generational cohort size. Here, as in the first cluster of essays, we are given a fine survey of some significant issues bound up with doing justice to the future but at the expense of a deeper engagement with them. The book ends with a discussion of the rights and interests of past and future persons. Past persons, Vernon concludes, cannot be subjects of justice. However, injustices done to them can persist among present persons and in that way endure and demand a response. Future persons by contrast can have their rights and interests affected by what we do in the here-and-now and so are, with some qualifications, possible claimants on us.

Overall, this is a fine introduction to many of the central issues in thinking about justice and time. Nevertheless, it has its limits. Some of those involve unfortunate omissions and gaps in the discussions. For example, in reflecting on the way in which a concern for cultural survival can be seen as reducing the autonomy of future generations, Kwame Anthony Appiah's powerful interventions are not mentioned. Similarly, in considering whether the dead are in any sense enduring subjects of justice, Joel Feinberg's, Annette C. Baier's and Jeffrey Blustein's significant efforts to suggest that they are such subjects go largely unremarked.

More worrisome are central questions that are not adequately explored. First, the underlying relationship between justice and temporality that generates the principal perplexities argued over in this book is itself only glancingly addressed. The comparison that Vernon draws between justice across time and across space points towards a core commonality: distance in time and space as diminishing the status of persons as subjects of justice. How to understand that radical absence of past and future persons, and how we nevertheless see ourselves having at least some community of justice with them, is a tension that calls for reflection. (Second, the present time is undertheorized, and in particular its relationship to the past and future. Yet the questions which motivate many of the essays are driven by the fact that the present is both the domain of the absence of past and future persons and the arena in which we seem called to do them justice, the domain in other words not of a pure present but a temporality in which the claims of past and future press upon us. The co-presence of absence and a moral community shared across time is the source of many of the perplexities of intergenerational justice addressed in this book. Reflection on that would have given the book a greater thematic unity.