Justice Through Apologies: Remorse, Reform, and Punishment

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Nick Smith, Justice Through Apologies: Remorse, Reform, and Punishment, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 402pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521189453.

Reviewed by Colleen Murphy, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


This book builds on Nick Smith's first, I Was Wrong. It presents and defends a practical framework for understanding the role apologies should play in the criminal and civil law, and contrasts this role with the function apologies currently do play in the United States. It also offers a detailed, interdisciplinary critical evaluation of the current legal system in the United States, which raises a rich set of issues for moral, political and legal theorists interested in understanding the conditions that must be in place for legal institutions to actually serve an important moral purpose.

In I Was Wrong Smith articulates and defends what he calls a categorical apology. Such an apology serves as a regulative ideal for acts of remorse (p. 17). The categorical apology has the following characteristics: it (1) documents and/or confirms the factual record of what happened; (2) specifies the harm inflicted through wrongdoing in detail; (3) explains why such harms are morally troubling by, paradigmatically, articulating the moral principle(s) violated; (4) demonstrates an acceptance of moral responsibility and blame for wrongdoing by the one who is apologizing, and the apologizer has the standing to accept such blame; (5) reflects a commitment to respecting the principles violated through wrongdoing in the future and acknowledges the legitimacy of the victim's reactive attitudes in the aftermath of wrongdoing; (6) is interactive in the sense that the victim is treated as a moral agent who is responsive to reason and who, in virtue of her agency, has a dignity that precludes her being treated as a mere means; (7) articulates the regret experienced by the wrongdoer for what she did and occurs in a context in which the wrongdoer feels guilty and sorry for what was done along with empathy for the victim; (8) occurs in a forum the victim has discretion in specifying (e.g., in a public or private forum); (9) is done for the sake of the victim and for the sake of affirming values violated (rather than for the sake of the offender's well-being); (10) expresses a commitment to reform; and (11) involves some attempt at the provision of redress.

Smith distills this conception of the categorical apology down to four moral imperatives: giving a detailed account of what happened, accepting blame as appropriate, providing compensation and not repeating the offense (p. 20). As he explicitly recognizes, the categorical apology is onerous. Few apologies in practice will actually satisfy all of the conditions he lays out. And in many cases an appropriate apology may not require all of the above elements; depending on the nature of the wrong done, a more or less robust apology is apt. To show the general way an analysis of apologies using the categorical framework might proceed, Smith discusses the 2008 apology of then New York governor Eliot Spitzer, following revelations he was using an escort service. Spitzer's apology failed, Smith argues, to meet many of the above criteria. In particular, there was no specification of the harms caused through his actions.

Smith's objective is to apply the framework developed in I Was Wrong to apologies offered in legal contexts. He considers the role of apologies in criminal and civil contexts. There are a number of starting assumptions that frame his discussion. First, Smith concentrates on the use of apologies in the legal system in the United States. Second, he views the United States legal system as deeply flawed.. In his words, there is

no coherent or consistent set of principles guiding its massive criminal justice system. Instead, we have an ideological storm of highly contestable beliefs blowing in various directions . . . Very few questions regarding why the criminal justice system's ultimate objectives -- for instance, why we punish drug offenses with lengthy sentences -- are met with sensible answers. Attempting to carve out a sensible treatment of apologies within such Kafkaesque institutions can feel like a fool's errand. (p. 40)

Moreover, a recurring worry for Smith is the differential treatment of the privileged within the United States by the criminal justice system, and a subsequent concern that his proposal not be such that this advantage is exacerbated. Finally, the sheer number of prisoners in the United States is itself morally concerning (25% of the world's prisoners are in the United States, though the United States has only 5% of the world's population). In Smith's view an overhaul of criminal justice in the United States is needed.

Against this background, Smith argues that court-ordered apologies in criminal contexts are unjustifiable for both retributive and consequentialist reasons. Court-ordered apologies yield, he claims, few consequentialist benefits. The deterrent effects are minimal, and they rarely contribute to the rehabilitation of perpetrators. Insofar as retributivists endorse humiliation as a form of justified suffering that is permissible to inflict on perpetrators of wrongdoing, court-ordered apologies could be justified. However, Smith finds the humiliating character of court-ordered apologies unjustified. Humiliating treatment is unjustified for its own sake, and further alienates perpetrators from their community. Reconciliation between perpetrator and victim is furthermore unlikely to be achieved by court-ordered apologies. Victims will likely find less meaning in an apology that is forced rather than voluntarily offered. And being forced to apologize can increase hostility felt towards victims by perpetrators. And the emphasis by the state on the assumption of personal responsibility and personal blame for wrongdoing implicit in orders to apologize can distract attention from the conditions that lead to crime in the first place and the systemic problems within the criminal justice system itself.

Though he does not support court-ordered apologies, Smith does think that it is justified to reduce sentences for those who voluntarily apologize and whose apologies satisfy to a sufficient threshold the categorical apology standards (p. 39). Such reductions can have positive consequences; voluntary apologies make it possible for perpetrators to commit to forswearing future crime in a way that gives them agency and control over their futures and an entry back into the community upon the completion of their sentences (which in turn can reduce the likelihood of recidivism). On what Smith calls communicative retributive views, moral transformation of the perpetrator is part of the overarching objective of punishment. Voluntary apologies demonstrate that the overarching retributive purpose of punishment has already to some extent been achieved, which in turn can justify diminishing the infliction of suffering intended to achieve this end. Smith ends his treatment of the criminal law by offering a practical framework for implementing his recommendation. Specifically, he articulates questions that can guide review of voluntary apologies, which roughly map on to the features of the categorical apology articulated above, and should be applied to specific cases by qualified evaluators who have been explicitly trained to use these standards.

While I find the argument for the differences between coercive and voluntary apologies convincing in theory, I am not convinced these differences would be realized in practice. In the overall coercive context of the criminal justice system, discussion of "voluntary" consent or action in general is contentious. When individual perpetrators face the prospect of a lengthier sentence absent categorical apologetic actions, they may feel under significant pressure to "voluntarily" apologize, without such apologies reflecting a change in outlook or commitment to the nonrepetition that the voluntary apology ideally communicates. This is especially true in a system where few cases come to trial and most cases are settled through plea bargain. In this context, the option for voluntary apology may have the same humiliating character and limited consequential benefits as court-ordered apologies.

After considering the criminal law, Smith turns to the civil law. He begins by highlighting the objective shared by many pursuing civil damages of receiving an apology through the civil process. He finds the function of apologies in the current legal context troubling, failing to actually satisfy the needs that motivate victims to desire an apology in the first place and cynically used by offenders.

Smith's interdisciplinary treatment of apologies in the law has a number of virtues. It draws on come actual cases from law where apologies were issued. For example, Smith considers Donna Bailey, who was paralyzed from the neck down following a rollover crash and sued both Ford and Firestone. Hers was one of a number of cases of such rollovers. Ford visited Bailey while she was still in the hospital, a visit that was recorded and which subsequently led to a settlement for an undisclosed sum. The book begins with the case of William Beebe, who drugged and raped an eighteen-year-old student at a party at the University of Virginia, and sent her a letter twenty-one years later apologizing. These cases drive home the point that apologies do play an increasingly central role in the law. And Smith offers some compelling practical suggestions for how to better deal with apologies in the law in the United States.

Despite these virtues, I found the book frustrating to read. The heavy theoretical reliance on I Was Wrong, coupled with the frequent reference to points made in that book, diminished the quality of Justice Through Apologies as a stand-alone volume. If you haven't read Smith's first book, you may not be familiar with its main theoretical innovations and its grounding for central claims, both necessary when reading the second book. In addition, while the detailed case studies were welcome and demonstrated the practical significance of the subject matter being considered, the details about the cases at times overwhelmed the theoretical point being made through case illustrations. This has the unfortunate consequence of leaving the reader with the sense that too much theoretical terrain was being covered too quickly.

Finally, the restricted focus on the use of apologies in the United States (with a few limited exceptions) is, in my view, a limitation. Smith starts from an explicit recognition of the deep structural flaws of the criminal justice system in the United States, which raises questions about the general implications of his analysis. It is unclear, for example, if the concerns about apologies in civil law are concerns that are salient for legal systems outside of the United States. Moreover, the use of apologies is increasingly prominent in the context of countries dealing with legacies of political wrongdoing and attempting to transition to democracy. Some comparative consideration of uses of apologies in the criminal and civil law for political wrongdoing in transitional societies would have enriched the discussion. More generally, the turn to apologies in law is a global phenomenon. In this context, some justification or explanation for the almost exclusive focus on the United States is needed.