Kafka's The Trial: Philosophical Perspectives

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Espen Hammer (ed.), Kafka's The Trial: Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2018, 312pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190461447.

Reviewed by Rafe McGregor, Leeds Trinity University


This is the third in the Oxford Studies in Philosophy and Literature series, following Shakespeare's Hamlet (edited by Tzachi Zamir) and Ibsen's Hedda Gabler (edited by Kristin Gjesda), both published earlier this year. The anthology is edited by Espen Hammer, who has published extensively on German philosophy and the work of Theodor Adorno and of Stanley Cavell. Hammer's contribution includes the introduction as well as one of the nine essays on The Trial, which was first published as Der Proceß in 1925, a year after Kafka's death. The former introduces Kafka, the curious history of the novel, its subject and themes, the context of its admission to the canon, and its legacy for literature, philosophy, and cinema. Hammer is quick to distinguish the purpose of this Oxford Study from previous commentary, criticism, and interpretation on and of Kafka, stating that the contributors 'have sought to highlight how its philosophical layers are shaped by literary form' (p.2).

In making this claim, Hammer aligns himself with the project Zamir (editor of Shakespeare's Hamlet) identifies as philosophical criticism and defines as 'an orientation and a sensitivity to the limitations of standard argumentative prose and an attunement to the way these can be overcome through reflection that is interpenetrated with literature.'[1] Zamir notes that philosophical criticism has had a limited impact on literary criticism, and John Gibson discusses one of the reasons for this failure in his essay, that ethical criticism in particular has focused on the representational content of literature: a gross oversimplification from the perspective of literary theory. Hammer's intention is to explore the relationship between literary form and philosophical content and in so doing illuminate both The Trial's literary significance and its philosophical relevance, encouraging greater dialogue between the two disciplines. His attention to the way in which Kafka's form creates, constructs, or fashions meaning establishes a criterion for the success of these essays, i.e., that they should articulate how the various philosophical themes of The Trial are enriched, explored, or elucidated by its various literary devices. As all nine authors demonstrate, overcoming philosophical limitations with literary reflection is especially challenging with respect to Kafka because of the elusive, reticent, and hermetic character of his oeuvre.

Peter E. Gordon's "Kafka's Inverse Theology" is an elucidation of the relationship between religion and hopelessness in The Trial. Gordon argues that Adorno's most important insight into Kafka is that his theology is inverse rather than negative, the abandonment of any affirmation of the divine rather than the recognition that God transcends human representation. In so doing, Gordon introduces the first three of four topics that will recur in most of the essays to follow: the criticism, commentary, and correspondence on Kafka by (i) Adorno and (ii) Walter Benjamin; and (iii) the parable of the doorkeeper and (iv) Titorelli's paintings as essential, substantial, or exemplary to or of the meaning of the novel. Fred Rush's "Before the Law" is, as the title suggests, devoted to (iii), specifically to its dual significance in revealing the natures of deception and the law in The Trial. Rush argues that Kafka's employment of the parable as a parable, within the ninth chapter, within the overarching narrative, has two significant effects. First, it reveals the resistance of the fictional world to the protagonist's attempts at navigation. Second, it defines human being in terms of guilt such that guilty applies to human in the same sense that aquatic applies to fish. Although Rush's essay is one of the finest in the anthology, it foregrounds the repeated reference to the parable, which begins on the second page of Hammer's introduction and ends at the beginning of the last section of the last essay. While each contributor has something interesting and original to say about it, the constant return to such a small part of the novel becomes predictable and even a little wearisome as one's reading progresses.

In "On the Ethical Character of Literature", John Gibson starts with a critique of the standard approach to ethical criticism in literary aesthetics, which he calls the attitudinal model, i.e. the focus on representational content mentioned above.[2] Gibson proposes a dichotomy between the didactic and the critical as two routes to ethical significance, where the former is reliant upon content and the latter on 'creating an awareness, by extra-representational means, of this contrast between our world and one worth having' (p.101). The Trial is a paradigmatic example of the need for criticality in literary aesthetics because the whole novel constitutes a condemnation of our world and the possibility of an ethical elsewhere to which we can aspire. Gerhard Richter's "'A Disease of All Signification': Kafka's The Trial Between Adorno and Agamben" traces the relationship between the literal and the figural in The Trial. Richter shows how Kafka's writing both demands and denies a literal interpretation and claims that the parable of the doorkeeper is a problematisation of the relation between these two dimensions of the text, as well as an epigram of the novel. He concludes that philosophical criticism must recognise the implications of this relation and resist the temptation to ignore the figural. Iain Macdonald's "Unfettering the Future: Estrangement and Ambiguity in The Trial" argues that Kafka's conception of estrangement is 'the current unavailability of a better future', which recalls Gibson on the worthlessness of our world (p.146). Macdonald's prognosis is, however, less optimistic: Kafka is not identifying an imperfect world as a starting point for improvement, but demonstrating how that imperfect world blocks the path to improvement.

In "The Trouble with Time: Kafka's Der Proceß", Anne Fuchs investigates the threefold relevance of 'dyschronia', the pathological experience of time (p.178). Kafka struggled to balance the competing demands of work, family, and writing in his life, employing a variety of strategies in vain attempts to make the most of his allotted time. This dyschronia is enacted by Kafka in his representation of time in The Trial, despite the fact that the novel takes place over precisely one calendar year. Finally, K's dyschronia -- which is a mirror of Kafka's -- is evinced by his tiredness, lateness, or distractedness at crucial points in the narrative. Howard Caygill's "Judges, Heathscapes, and Hazardous Quarries: Kafka and the Repetitive Image-Series" compares "Accident Prevention in Quarries", a photographic documentary assembled by Kafka in the course of his duties at the Workers' Accident Insurance Institute, with Titorelli's paintings as revealed in chapter seven of The Trial. Caygill draws attention to the seriality of the photographs in the article, the aspects of the goddess in the portrait, and the identical landscapes in order to make a startlingly optimistic interpretation of the novel.

Hammer is clear about the purpose of "Kafka's Modernism: Intelligibility and Voice in The Trial", which is to argue that Kafka is a modernist in virtue of his focus on the conditions of intelligible speech. He contrasts the superficial transparency of Kafka's prose with numerous passages that 'resist not only the imposition of an unequivocal interpretation but also the attribution of an origin in a responsible speaker's intention' (p.231). This recalls both Richter's concern with the literal and figural and Gibson's concern with philosophical criticality, and Hammer concludes that Kafka's modernism is characterised by his analysis of the relationship between intelligibility and unintelligibility in the ordinary use of language. Elizabeth S. Goodstein's "Displacements on a Pathless Terrain: On Reading Kafka's Der Proceß" makes extensive use of Benjamin's writing on Kafka to compare the way in which each responds to the challenge presented by the dichotomy between philosophy and literature. She contends that Benjamin's reading of The Trial -- in particular, the significance he accorded to Kafka's combination of mystical experience with modern metropolitanism -- illuminates the structure of the reconfiguration of the boundaries among philosophy, literature, and history in his own navigation of modernity.

As mentioned above, Hammer distinguishes the essays in Kafka's Trial from previous Kafka criticism in terms that I described as a criterion for philosophical criticism, namely the articulation of Kafka's employment of literary devices to enrich, explore, or elucidate philosophical themes. Measured against this criterion, the nine essays fall neatly into three categories: three that are unqualified successes, three that are partial successes, and three that are failures. Rush, Gibson, and Richter all clearly succeed. In each case, there is a literary device or a combination of literary devices (the parable, the inseparability of critical form and ethical content, and the relationship between the literal and the figural respectively) that performs the work of philosophy (defining human being in Rush and reconstituting philosophical criticism in Gibson and Richter). As such, all three essays are paradigmatic examples of philosophical criticism. Macdonald, Fuchs, and Hammer seem to meet the criterion partially. In their respective explorations of estrangement, dyschronia, and unintelligibility in The Trial, they exhibit insight and rigour in exegeses that offer more than mere interpretations of the novel. The philosophical significance of these explorations is not entirely clear, however, as Hammer's essay shows. Although his contribution is the most philosophical of the three, drawing on the work of Ludwig Wittgenstein and Cavell, the philosophical argument is pressed into the service of literature, in order to establish Kafka as a (literary) modernist.

Gordon, Caygill, and Goodstein all fail to meet the criterion. Gordon and Caygill's essays are both interpretations of The Trial, and while the former's is fascinating, the extended engagement with Adorno's philosophical criticism does not elevate the essay above the level of interpretation. In contrast, while Caygill's method -- the comparison and contrast of related documentary and fiction -- is innovative, his conclusion is unconvincing ; and there are times when his argument slips between the portrait as series and the landscape as series (aside from which, one might argue that neither constitutes a series). Goodstein's essay neither examines the relation between literary device and philosophical theme nor provides an interpretation of what she calls the 'not-quite-a-novel' (p.263). Instead, she presents a literary history of Benjamin's reception of the work and of Kafka's influence on Benjamin, which will no doubt be of great interest to Benjamin and Kafka scholars but cannot be considered philosophical criticism by any stretch of the imagination. My insistence on measuring the essays against Hammer's criterion -- or perhaps my interpretation of his classification as a criterion -- may well be considered uncharitable. My reasons for doing so are twofold. First, Hammer's classification is consistent with the clarity, logic, and precision characteristic of philosophical criticism and thus exemplary of that tradition. Second, Hammer's classification foregrounds the main problem with philosophical criticism, identified by Zamir as its limited impact on literary theory.

In order to be taken seriously in the way that Gibson suggests, philosophical criticism must do something more than provide a set of different interpretations of works; and Hammer describes this something more in terms of literary form and philosophical content, specifically how the former shapes the latter. The focus on form (or, if one prefers, the relationship between form and content) distinguishes philosophical criticism from the naïve ethical criticism of which Gibson disapproves and places the former firmly within the purview of literary criticism.[3] In other words, by their focus on how literary form shapes philosophical content, authors such as Rush, Gibson, and Richter achieve two separate aims: (a) they bring philosophers to literature, in this case to The Trial, in search of ways to overcome the limits of the argumentation with which they are already familiar; and (b) they bring literary critics to philosophical criticism, introducing that criticism to the institution of literature, which is where it belongs. Hammer's classification is so pertinent to both the existence and the value of philosophical criticism that it serves as a criterion for membership in this tradition. A criterion both permits and prohibits admission, however, and my only substantial criticism of the anthology is that the essays do not all belong to the tradition of philosophical criticism. Notwithstanding, the work is an excellent resource for the interdisciplinary audience at which is aimed, students and scholars in the fields of literary aesthetics and modernist literature, and a strong addition to Oxford's Studies in Philosophy and Literature.

[1] Tzachi Zamir, Double Vision: Moral Philosophy and Shakespearean Drama (Princeton University Press, 2007), 47.

[2] I offer a similar critique in: Rafe McGregor, "A Critique of the Value Interaction Debate," British Journal of Aesthetics 54 (2014), 449-466.

[3] I discuss the relationship between form and content in literary representation in detail in: Rafe McGregor, The Value of Literature (Rowman and Littlefield, 2016).