Kant and his German Contemporaries: Volume II: Aesthetics, History, Politics, and Religion

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Daniel O. Dahlstrom (ed.), Kant and his German Contemporaries: Volume II: Aesthetics, History, Politics, and Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 285pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107178168.

Reviewed by Anne Pollok, University of South Carolina


This is the second volume of an important series for Anglophone scholars interested in Kant's intellectual contemporaries, ranging from generally overlooked Enlightenment heavy-weights such as Johann Jakob Moser to the adamant Kant-critics Herder, Jacobi, and Hamann, and to Kant's creative students such as Fichte and Schiller.

The current volume offers an amazing mix of contributors that ensures a rich, informative range of perspectives, and is also notable for its accuracy of information, excellent writing, and willingness to take on some uncharted roads in aesthetics, history, politics, and religion. It is a particular pleasure for a German scholar working in the States (such as myself) to see how fruitful it can be if Anglophone researchers take note of German secondary literature -- which is still not the norm and sometimes prevents deeper treatments of the history of philosophy in Germany. To be sure, the tendency to overlook secondary sources outside of the Anglophone literature is partly due to the fact that German-speaking academic systems still lack a good education in academic writing -- and that sometimes shows (though it has tended to get better in the last ten years) in meandering papers that might contain important information, yet are arduous to read. But, as some of the volume's contributions show, using all the information out there indeed enriches an argument.

Overall, I would have wished for more insight into even more unlikely candidates, as nearly all the thinkers presented are the usual suspects -- maybe with the exception of Winckelmann, whose seminal influence on aesthetics and history is acknowledged, but barely closely considered, and Moser, again a name well-known among experts, but less studied by the majority of scholars. There are, however, many more who are barely mentioned, including:  Johann Georg Sulzer who asked interesting questions of psychology in the area of aesthetic appreciation; Thomas Abbt and Johann Joachim Spalding who considered history in light of issues in theodicy and the conundrum regarding the vocation of man; Gottfried Achenwall and other Natural Law representatives in political philosophy; Johann Erich Biester and his colleagues from the Berlin Wednesday Society with their initiation of problematizing and systematizing the quest for a proper Enlightenment; and the Romantic movement's concern with Kant's philosophy of religion. Completely left out are women philosophers. This might be due to the fact that most points of convergence -- if at all -- are more notable in the area of theoretical philosophy. But since that aspect was also overlooked in the first volume this could have been an interesting and novel field of inquiry. Alas, this is the typical fate of such volumes: everybody could envisage a different group of thinkers, and some other aspect in the respective field to be discussed. As it is, this volume engages interesting questions and perspectives, thus enriching our awareness of Kant's seminal role in the philosophy of his time. The "new respect for the richly distinctive character of eighteenth-century German thought" (2) is indeed responsible for this thought-provoking and encompassing endeavor that should inform and broaden future debates on all things Kantian.

Aesthetic Perspectives

The volume opens with an erudite and historically sensitive piece by J. Colin McQuillan on Kant's view on aesthetic perfection compared to Baumgarten's and Meier's. Their notion of aesthetic perfection is twofold: Metaphysically speaking, a perfect object produces pleasure in that its constituting parts form a coherent whole perceivable by the observer. Epistemologically speaking, aesthetics is the science of confused perception of perfection (an area Baumgarten kept strictly distinct from logic, which was concerned with clear and distinct ideas alone) that can be quite independent of the object itself. Even the early, pre-critical Kant, as McQuillan points out, was quite conscious of this distinction -- "because he does not even consider the possibility that beauty could be a property of objects that exist independently of our sensation or cognition" (17). This forced Kant also to reconsider the distinction between cognition and feeling -- an issue that is of fundamental importance for his critical stance on aesthetics. Thus, the early Kant's discussion of Meier and Baumgarten not only expands their notions, but offers some unique specifications that prefigure the critical turn. Kant does reconsider his concept of a non-determinate but still a priori judgment (see p. 22), which he now calls a judgment of taste. This offers a new way of understanding aesthetics as part of the critical project, and as a kind of 'science' on its own. McQuillan does an excellent job making these developments comprehensible through comparison with contemporaneous perfectionism, and also, using Kant's lecture notes, by highlighting how Kant incorporated these thoughts in his own writings.

In his equally historically sensitive piece, Paul Guyer showcases some striking similarities between Kant and Mendelssohn, the eminent aesthetician of the time. The two key points of convergence between these thinkers are, first, the relation of aesthetic pleasure (Kant) or perfection (Mendelssohn) to the activity of the mind, and, second, Kant's concept of purposiveness in alignment with Mendelssohn's 'subjective' turn of perfection. Indeed, Mendelssohn's further development of Baumgarten's thesis in the 1771 version of the Rhapsody, that beautiful perception has two sources -- the beauty of the object perceived, but even more so the beauty of the perception itself (there is also the beauty of the mind of the creator, whether god or artist, which Guyer overlooks) -- allows us to understand aesthetics as a reflective mode of judgment in a similar way to Kant. That Kant does not acknowledge this might be due to external factors such as his keen interest to keep all attempts to turn Critical philosophy into just one other mode of Leibnizianism at bay, or, to keep the influence of emotions out of the greater area of practical philosophy -- but that does not quite justify his silence on this issue.

At times, Guyer might even fall for the seductive option of aligning both writers too closely. For instance, I doubt that we can stay true to Kant's mature ideas about aesthetics if we add the physiologically pleasing aspect of aesthetic experience to the free play of the imagination (32) that Mendelssohn's Theokles mentions in the Letters on Sentiments (first 1755, then 1761/71). But overall, Guyer offers a compelling argument as to why any further development of a Kantian aesthetics would benefit greatly from listening more closely to Kant's contemporaries.

Michael Baur discusses the importance of Winckelmann, the founder of German Classicism, for Kant's work. Winckelmann, author of the Gedancken über die Nachahmung der Griechischen Werke (1755) and the Geschichte der Kunst des Altertums (1764), claimed that a consideration of the history of art is essential to understanding art itself. As human aesthetic sensibility, but also the influence of climate, heritage, social, sociological, and historical conditions all come to the fore in art, art history is also a philosophy of culture, or a pragmatic anthropology.

Baur's central point is that Winckelmann introduced the concept of imitation (of the Greeks) not as a mere copying, but a specific form of idealization. In a way, the artist is the mediating figure between the condensed beauty of art and the far grander, but dispersed beauty of nature. Thus, it is mainly art that makes us see and appreciate beauty rather than the other way around. It would have helped to point out how contemporaneous art indeed achieved such a feat (for instance, Albrecht von Haller's poem Die Alpen (1729) helped people appreciate the natural beauty of this taunting landscape). The decisive flaw of this paper, however, is the somewhat forced connection to Kant, who is only presented with his mature thoughts on aesthetics in the CPJ. The nearly three decades between Winckelmann's works and the CPJ, one might think, help a lot to explain why these two thinkers differ so much, in particular concerning the object of aesthetic judgment.

Historical Perspectives

The philosophical relation between Kant and Winckelmann is more historically aptly treated in the next section by Elisabeth Décultot who shifts the focus from aesthetics to history, even though the thinkers, with the addition of Herder, stay the same. Décultot's main point is that Winckelmann, quite in contrast to Anne Claude de Caylus and Herder, favors the heredity model of Greek superiority over the climatological. This is due to Winckelmann's overall "naturalization of Greek culture" (74): all causes appear to be ultimately linked to nature rather than nurture. Herder, Décultot shows, is more finely attuned to the importance of cultural transmissions (85) -- but, as fruitful as this avenue seems to be, the reader does not get much more than a page on his thoughts. Instead, Décultot offers an interesting view on Winckelmann's influence on Kant's aesthetics (88-89, in particular the notion of "Reiz" and pure beauty, which Winckelmann found more in male than female bodies) and anthropology (89-90). However, the comparison to Kant's philosophy of history is a bit sparse; I would have put Décultot's paper into the previous section.

In her insightful contribution, Lydia L. Moland tackles Kant's and Schiller's fascination with human education in and through history. As is well-known, Schiller considered himself a Kantian of sorts after his discovery of the CPJ in the 1790s. However due to his earlier education in Medicine and the rationalistic theories of human self-formation (which combined the question concerning human nature with issues of human culture, thus aiming for an encompassing picture of humanity), he was also not willing to align his ideas completely with Kantian dualism. Instead, Schiller argues for a coordination of social and asocial, rational and irrational tendencies. While Kant's conjectural history follows his idea of improvement through conflict, ensured by humanity's unsociable sociability that can indeed be turned into a delay-circle allowing for conscious moral actions and interactions (96-97), Schiller takes a slightly different route, making use of the intertwined functionality of imagination and understanding without rejecting human sensitivity, but stressing its transformative power on emotions in general (106) which in the long run makes education through war and "a church triumphant" (107) utterly superfluous. To highlight Schiller's deviation more succinctly, a reference to, for instance, Wolfgang Riedel's early study Die Anthropologie des jungen Schiller (Würzburg 1985) could have enriched and focused this paper to show that the Aesthetic Education is indeed "deeply consonant with the rest of his philosophy" (108). But as it is, this paper is a wonderful stepping stone toward expanding the discussion of some central Kantian notions of human history and destiny.

In his fascinating paper, Nigel DeSouza explains why Kant saw his younger philosophical self looking back at him in Herder's philosophy. Herder's conception, however, is even more strictly naturalistic, in that he explains all interactions of soul and body, but also of forces and matter as phenomena of natural forces (111). DeSouza highlights Herder's indebtedness to the early Kant, and contrasts this vision with Kant's mature thoughts. Ultimately, Herder argues for an organic, visible and invisible, "highest, . . . most active force" (cit. 115) permeating the whole human (natural as well as cultural-historical) world. DeSouza's particular aim is to counter one of Kant's key criticisms: that whenever we deal with 'invisible forces', we lack possible experience to back up our claims. Herder claims that, by the method of analogy and the fundamental assumption of the sameness of all the forces at work in nature, we can indeed draw conclusions about the spiritual realm that we might not be able to see, but that we can glimpse through its "manifest operations" right in front of us (124). Ultimately, I still like Herder's critique much more than his answer since it highlights a gap in Kant's thinking that still needs to be addressed.

Political Perspectives

The next thematic group begins with a rather surprising piece by Kristi Sweet, who links Mendelssohn, the important enlightenment philosopher and highly influential thinker of the Haskalah, to an unusual ally: Martin Luther. As Sweet argues, both Kant and Mendelssohn develop their theory of enlightenment, in particular concerning the limits of church and state as well as the direction of history, in light of a somewhat Lutheran conception of conscience. But, whereas for Kant, "conscience demands nothing less than the transformation of the natural order . . . into something rational" (149) and thus allows for a rational conception of progress in history, Mendelssohn is more skeptical, and formulates a liberal theory of consciousness and state: for him, social institutions should enable the individual to develop her capacities mainly by offering the space to do so freely and without interference by said institutions.

However, I take issue with the general direction of Sweet's systematic (and explicitly not historical, see p. 135, fn. 5) account for two reasons. First, it misconstrues Mendelssohn's position in German Enlightenment philosophy as a representative of Judaism, rather than Lutheranism. Second, for historical reasons, Mendelssohn could not react to Kant's full practical philosophy, whose main tenets were developed after Mendelssohn's death in early 1786. But since Mendelssohn's argument turns on the issue of the political power of a religion, Judaism as the religion in the defense needs to get the last word in such a fight -- which it cannot in the 'systematic' way that Sweet presents here. Kant's commitment to finding a reasonable streak in history seems rather to highlight Mendelssohn's concern that establishing a goal toward which all history (and so all religion) must develop simply repeats an old power play in which the reigning religious creed showcases itself as the most reasonable one without a good enough reason (but by power). That way, we rather come to see that the lion and the lamb can only live side by side in the lion's world. But to ensure that Kant offers the better argument, we need to weigh the historical impact on this systematic question more carefully.

Ian Hunter's paper is truly a highlight with its fascinating and thorough review of the Anglophone and German secondary literature that offers a compelling overview of the historical framework necessary to understand the difference between Moser's and Kant's interest in law. In contrast to Moser's strategy (as a Reichspublizist) of connecting and systematizing the mess of existing treatises and laws, the Reichsphilosoph Kant derives his idea of public law from "inner philosophical reflection" (161) that is supposed to yield a transcendental grounding of these laws. But despite all fundamental differences, Hunter presents both approaches as methodological siblings: the Reichspublizist's "acts of reflection, problematization, conversion, purification, and affirmation" (162) are exactly what Kant transports into the realm of pure philosophy. Kant's theory thus offers the means to change a constitution in a rational way and becomes something like a watershed in the way public law was seen -- not as "the result of a series of compromises" between institutions, but as a means of how "a community of rational individuals would exercise the harmonized will that had forged the principle of justice" (164). Both agree that a religious creed cannot be legally perpetually binding -- Moser argues that Germans had suffered long enough in the unsolvable battle of creeds (157), and Kant offers the a priori principles that suffice to establish principles of justice in a civil society without a creed (165). Thus, the German constitution of his time was doubly unconstitutional in that it failed to reflect on the common will of free people, but also bound those people to an 'external' religious creed (166). This is indeed an admirable liberal (in the European sense) way of understanding the problematic interplay of law and religion that both thinkers showcase.

Gabriel Gottlieb's take on Fichte is another gem. Of course, a volume like this cannot fully stand without reference to Kant's most famous, and, I think, most ingenious student. Gottlieb presents Fichte within a "family quarrel" raging among early Kantians. In particular, he spells out Fichte's attractive theory of recognition which offers an important extension of Kantianism. Instead of deriving a notion of right from morality, Fichte offers a new take on the consistency theorem, giving it a theoretical and practical dimension so that it grounds the constitution of individuality by way of mutual relations of recognition among members of a social group. The practical dimension of recognition as "embodied agency" (190) reliant on mutual respect is crucial to better understand the early 19th century idea of individuality -- an idea that should indeed be more prominently considered when we endeavor to further develop a Kantian notion of right.

Religious Perspectives

Brian A. Chance and Lawrence Pasternack offer an intriguing new reading of the "Orientation Essay" and its extension in the Critique of Practical Reason (and the Religion). They not only show how the earlier essay fails to satisfy critics, but also how the CPR is a late reply to the vocal critic Thomas Wizenmann in more than just the footnote that explicitly mentions him. The practical need of reason is indeed focused on seeking happiness -- but, as Kant now emphasizes, this is not a mere subjective need, it rather must be understood in proportion to morality (the highest good). In the CPR, as Chance and Pasternack claim, Kant refers to happiness as a "happiness tempered through the moral law" (210) which should ensure that only those who act according to the moral law can truly become happy. This is not just how "impartial reason" would understand happiness, but how we would come to see it if we had the appropriate "change of heart" (212). As Kant argues in the Religion, through rational faith in the reality of the highest good we can finally overcome the bothersome misalignment of morality and happiness, in that we come to see that our happiness (seen in light of the highest good) can only be possible if we align the way in which we attempt to realize it with the attempt to become worthy of it. I am still unsure whether this argument can indeed secure the reality of the highest good even for those "who are not already bootstrapped into morality" (210). But this essay is a worthwhile read to clarify which arguments Kant actually made.

It seems that Herder, the key figure in Marion Heinz's wonderful essay, might indeed be skeptical about the aforementioned solution. In Herder's view, in particular concerning the connection of morality, happiness, and the immortality of the soul, Kant's idea of a postulate is lacking if compared with a richer account on nature and its continual metamorphosis that Herder captures in his notion of palingenesis as a "chain of effects" that integrates all rational agents throughout time. Reason as a natural capacity cannot stand outside of nature, but renews itself with it, and hence changes constantly. Kant was wrong to call our natural capacity inherently corrupt, and thus fails to offer a valid argument for the necessity of God (224-25), since it turns out to be dependent on morality as given by pure reason. A god dependent on something higher, alas, is a "non-God [Ungott]" (cit. 225). Instead, Herder offers a unified view of reason that should avoid the presumed necessary lapses into a dialectics. By his account, reason is the "judge of instances of empirical knowledge that have been laid down in language and universally communicated" (229). Being doubly bound by language, reason is "collective and historical" to its core. And thus, any exploration of its capacities cannot be done in a 'pure' manner, but instead by linguistic and historical observation, taking into consideration its actual and culturally diverse formations.

Another important critic of Kant's moral philosophy was Hamann, whom Daniel O. Dahlstrom discusses in the volume's final paper. Why indeed should the critical path be the only one left open? In his Metacritique, Hamann argues, among other things, that Kant's "substantive account of general ideas" (245) is bound to fail as a murky version of nominalism. Moreover, neither reason nor intuition can ever be 'pure', since all human thinking and feeling is bound by the senses. It may indeed be important to offer a self-critique of pure reason -- but, as Hamann notes, here reason is both the subject and object of the investigation. He asks how reason as the agent (subject) of investigation can be free from tradition, experience, and language (248), if it appears entrenched in all three in its role as the object of investigation? Instead, we should understand reason, with Hamann, as the unfolding of god's will in history. Even though Dahlstrom's critical take on Hamann's attempt at a way out of a mere language game is rather short, he offers a very interesting and rich systematic account of an unsystematic thinker.

Overall, this volume does an excellent job of highlighting the questions that Kant's contemporaries asked. It offers first-rate comparisons between these lesser known thinkers and Kant, albeit mainly in his critical role. Anyone interested in the impact of Kant's thinking, and also in the various ways in which Kant is indebted to the thinkers of his time, should find some time to thoroughly consider this excellent collection of papers.


I am deeply grateful to Michael L. Gregory for his insightful and helpful comments.