Kant and the Early Moderns

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Daniel Garber and Béatrice Longuenesse (eds.), Kant and the Early Moderns, Princeton University Press, 2008, 257pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691137018.

Reviewed by Andrew Janiak, Duke University


In May of 2004, Princeton held a conference on Kant's relationship to other figures in the early modern canon in honor of the late Margaret Wilson. This conference then led to an edited collection of ten essays that deal with that theme. The resulting volume, edited by Daniel Garber and Béatrice Longuenesse, is an impressive and sophisticated work that greatly advances our understanding of Kant's relationship with the philosophical tradition in the early modern period. Every contribution in the collection is a serious engagement with Kant or with Kant's relation to one of the following figures: Descartes, Locke, Leibniz, Berkeley and Hume. Each contributor brings considerable philosophical talents to bear on Kant's always complex relation to his various predecessors: this text gives one a nice picture of the current state-of-the-art thinking in the history of modern philosophy. The volume is a fitting tribute to Wilson. In sum, I recommend this work very highly.

As Garber and Longuenesse indicate in their preface, the collection consists of five pairs of essays, the first of which primarily concerns Kant and is written by a Kant specialist, and the second of which primarily concerns one of Kant's predecessors and is written by a specialist on that predecessor. To ensure that each contribution receives its due attention, I discuss each essay-pair in a pair of consecutive paragraphs, concluding with a general remark.

Kant and Descartes. Longuenesse's essay on Kant's relation to Descartes is too nuanced and complex to do it justice here, but I can tackle some of its themes. One of Longuenesse's principal moves is to deny the claim, often associated with Kant's reading of Descartes, that the cogito in the Second Meditation contains a syllogism of the following form:

(1) All things that think, exist.

(2) I think.

(3) Therefore, I exist.

Instead, Descartes embraces an inference of a different sort, arguing that my existence is a necessary condition of my thinking; that is, "I exist" is a necessary condition of "I think." And "I think" is true and known to be true by being thought by me. There is a sense in which I make it the case that "I think" is true by thinking it (or perhaps by thinking anything). In the first Critique, then, Kant may mischaracterize the kind of inference that Descartes presents in the Second Meditation. Kant's reaction to a later aspect of the Second Meditation -- where Descartes answers the famous question, What am I? -- may be more successful. According to Longuenesse, Kant is willing to endorse the contention I think, but is unwilling to allow that on this basis I can infer I am a thinking thing, at least if this latter claim actually means I am a thinking substance. (My only complaint here is that Longuenesse clarifies this aspect of Kant's criticism in an endnote; the main text leaves this point unclear.) That is, on the basis of the considerations Descartes adduces in the cogito and the accompanying text, if I am the meditator, I am not licensed to infer that I have obtained knowledge of a particular kind of substance, a thinking one. Longuenesse's essay concludes with an insightful discussion -- one building on her previous influential account of the so-called metaphysical deduction in the first Critique -- of how Kant's four-fold criticism of Descartes's "rational psychology" mirrors the four sets of logical forms of judgment, and of categories, in Kant's work. In short: in Kant's eyes, the rational psychologist argues mistakenly that I can know that I am a simple (indivisible) substance that is numerically identical over time.

In his response to Longuenesse, Beysade defends Descartes from some of Kant's criticisms by noting that Kant may not have read the Meditations itself, and lacked any clear interest in accurately reconstructing the arguments of Descartes or of any of his other predecessors. More specifically, Kant apparently failed to realize that Descartes does not actually employ the term substantia, and the notion of a substance, in the Second Meditation at all -- he does so for the first time in the Third Meditation -- but rather only the term res, and the notion of a thing. Hence Beysade implies that Kant misunderstood the conclusion of Descartes's inference in the cogito argument. He indicates that for Descartes, within the cogito I can be said to be acquainted with a "bodiless thing" rather than a substance. This is fair enough, and Beysade is certainly right in contending that Kant's reactions to Descartes in the first Critique are not always sympathetic and textually accurate. However, it remains an open question whether this aspect of Kant's criticism genuinely misses Descartes's point, for if we think of the Meditations as a whole, it is unclear what Descartes can mean by a res cogitans in the Second Meditation except what he calls a thinking substance later on. Perhaps Kant's point is that the considerations Descartes brings to bear in the cogito do not acquaint the meditator with any thing at all. To be self aware is not to be aware of a kind of entity. At any rate, more remains to be said about this aspect of Kant's criticism.

Kant and Leibniz. One often hears that in the "critical" period, Kant rejected his earlier Leibnizian opinions in favor of a philosophical standpoint that attempts to grapple with the knowledge of nature expressed in Newton's physics. In response, Jauernig makes the creative and provocative suggestion that we should understand Kant instead as embracing a Newtonian physical theory, but an essentially Leibnizian metaphysics. This is not to say that the critical Kant is a thoroughgoing Leibnizian -- Jauernig provides a detailed and insightful description of nine regions of philosophical dispute between Kant and Leibniz (her essay is worth reading just for this section of it). Her point, rather, is that Kant's criticisms of the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy should not be construed as criticisms of Leibniz himself; the metaphysical views of the critical Kant and of Leibniz bear a strong family resemblance, she claims, and belong to the same philosophical tradition. She then focuses her attention on the crucial question of how Kant understands Leibniz's view of space and time, using this case to buttress her general view that Kant aims in the first Critique to criticize various followers of Leibniz, but not Leibniz himself. In the appendix to the Transcendental Analytic, the so-called Amphiboly, Kant claims that Leibniz (or his followers) conceive of space as an order of the community of monads. But Jauernig argues that this cannot properly be read as a criticism of Leibniz, for he clearly took monads to lack spatial relations altogether, contending that bodies alone bear spatial relations and spatial predicates. She concludes by noting that Leibniz should not be understood as a transcendental realist at all, although that view can be attributed to some of his followers and defenders. There is no doubt that many Kant scholars in the past have failed to disentangle Leibniz's own metaphysical views -- concerning space and time, monads, etc. -- from those of his various followers, especially Baumgarten and Wolff. And there is also little doubt that Kant held Leibniz in very high esteem. In these respects, Jauernig's position seems convincing. As she herself is aware, however, the details of Kant's criticisms of Leibnizian views are exceedingly complex. To focus just on the case of space, for instance, there is reasonably strong evidence that in the Transcendental Aesthetic -- and perhaps later in the first Critique -- Kant in fact characterizes both Leibniz and Newton as defending versions of transcendental realism (despite their opposing views regarding the question of space's relational or absolute status). One reason for this characterization may be that from Kant's perspective, Leibniz fails to recognize space's "relation to our intuition," which is needed to evade the transcendental realist conception of space (see A36/B52-3; cf. A23/B38 and A39/B56). This connects, in turn, to an aspect of Kant's rejection of Leibniz's views that Jauernig does highlight, namely the claim that our representation of space is not a concept, but rather an intuition (a singular, immediate representation). There is something to be said for the idea that from this single seed, the rest of Kant's disagreements with Leibniz grow.

In his reaction to Jauernig's essay, Garber rightly notes that many of the texts we now associate with Leibniz -- including the correspondence with Arnauld, with de Volder and with Des Bosses, and the Discours -- were not published during Kant's lifetime, and that Kant was influenced by the standard stories in the late eighteenth century regarding the principal views of Leibniz and his followers (stories that did not always differentiate between the founder of the movement and his comrades). Garber also convincingly argues that the difficulty in assessing Kant's criticisms of Leibniz's understanding of space can be traced in part to the complexity of Leibniz's conception of how space relates to monads. Although Jauernig is surely right that Leibniz did not think of monads as bearing spatial relations or spatial predicates, he did contend that no monad is entirely "separated" from every body; although Leibniz did not think of monads as extended, he did contend that monads have a "relation" to extension. The idea of this "relation" must be connected to Leibniz's view that bodies bear spatial relations and predicates, and that monads are not parts of bodies, but are somehow their "foundation." In the least, then, Garber indicates that there is more to be said on this perplexing topic -- Kant was probably too quick in contending that Leibniz's views on space could be accurately characterized in a nutshell. Putnam once said that any philosophy that can be put in a nutshell, belongs in one -- luckily for Leibniz, his cannot, and does not.

Kant and Locke. Guyer approaches the question of how Kant's understanding of the limits to human knowledge compares with Locke's understanding of those limits in a creative and helpful way, focusing much of his attention on the issue of empirical knowledge. If we leave aside Kant's transcendental idealism, which of course raises many puzzles of its own, and focus on Kant's conception of empirical knowledge, we find a rather clean break with Locke's conception of the fundamental limits to empirical knowledge. From Locke's point of view, the basic capacities of the human sensory organs give rise to some clear limits on the knowledge that we can obtain of bodies that are far away or microscopic. Since for Locke there is no clear way of extending our sensory capacities, there is no clear way of transcending these limits to empirical knowledge. Hence we face what Locke calls a huge abyss of ignorance. Guyer then argues that despite Kant's idealism at what we might call the meta-level, he envisions no such limits to empirical knowledge. Of course, even if human inquiry extends indefinitely into the future, at any given moment within our history, we will have obtained some finite amount of information about nature, remaining ignorant about the rest of it; but Kant thinks that at no point in our history is there any fundamental limit to the empirical knowledge that we can in principle obtain. Despite the obvious limits to our sensory capacities, we can make reasonable inferences regarding microscopic entities (Guyer cites in this connection the famous passage regarding "magnetic matter" in the first Critique -- A226/B273). Guyer finds this aspect of Kant's thinking attractive, as would many contemporary philosophers. His essay highlights a respect in which philosophers of science with little interest in transcendental idealism may wish to reevaluate Kant.

Downing's response to Guyer's essay makes an impressive case that Locke's conception of empirical knowledge has more flexibility than some of the more famous pronouncements in the Essay might lead us to believe. Locke's conception of our understanding of matter, for instance, was not static: in response to the achievement of Newton's Principia (the first edition of which preceded the first edition of the Essay by three years), he admitted in his correspondence with Stillingfleet that God may have "superadded" gravity to matter. Locke apparently took matter to be "extended solid substance," and he thought that we cannot conceive of how any material object as such could gravitate toward any other material object -- but he took Newton to have shown that material objects do gravitate toward one another, which means, perhaps, that we have reason to believe that God superadded gravity to matter (hence gravity characterizes causal interactions in nature, but does not flow from matter's essence). According to Downing, Locke may also have believed that Newton's results suggest that we cannot simply endorse the contact action principle of the mechanists, as Locke may have previously thought. The essays of Guyer and Downing clearly show that there is more to be said about the different responses to empirical science found in Locke and in Kant.

Kant and Berkeley. Kant's relationship with Berkeley was vexed from the start: the famous Garve-Feder review of the first Critique's first edition apparently encouraged Kant, in the Prolegomena and in the second edition of the first Critique, to distance his brand of idealism from Berkeley's. In her detailed and complex essay, Edmundts argues that one of Kant's primary complaints might be characterized in this way: although Berkeley evades transcendental realism about space, unlike Leibniz and Newton, he does so at the cost of contending that our representation of space is merely empirical. Hence Kant regards Berkeley as failing to recognize that we have a non-empirical representation of space -- in this connection, the first two arguments of the Metaphysical Exposition in the Aesthetic are crucial for understanding Kant's reaction to Berkeley. Edmundts intriguingly suggests that for Kant, Berkeley actually oversteps the basic limits to cognition by claiming to know that there is no mind-independent reality, rather than limiting himself to the more epistemically modest view that we cannot obtain knowledge of any such reality. It would be unfair to Edmundts' intricate analysis of Kant's conception of objectivity to characterize it here, but I highly recommend her essay for this reason.

Winkler's essay involves a surprising confession: originally convinced that Kant's characterizations of Berkeley betrayed a basic ignorance of the texts, he eventually came to the view that in certain key respects, Kant's reaction to Berkeley's idealism is fundamentally reasonable. These respects are as follows: Kant may be right in thinking that from Berkeley's point of view, ordinary bodies have a "diminished reality" in comparison with spirits, and it may be fair to say that for Berkeley, bodies are in fact merely representations (they do not cause representations), and that these representations, in turn, can then be understood as the only bodies that exist. This may be sufficient for Kant to distinguish his idealism from Berkeley's, especially if we read Kant as thinking that bodies fill space and time and serve as the cause of representations that do not.

Kant and Hume. Waxman thinks of Hume as presenting two fundamental challenges to Kant, one "conceptual" and the other "epistemic." Hume argues that we lack any concept corresponding to the rationalist idea of a cause (which involves the idea of a necessary connection) -- Kant must respond by showing that we can have such a concept, which would be a concept of a necessary connection between non-conceptually related items. (Waxman considers the relation between the concepts of a mountain and a valley to fail this criterion, but the relation between the concepts of fire and smoke to meet it.) The epistemic challenge indicates that we cannot know the causal law a priori; instead, only custom or habit gives us the causal law. I'll focus on the conceptual challenge: Waxman very reasonably locates Kant's response in the metaphysical deduction of the categories, which may explain the origin of our concept of a cause (it obviously does not lie in experience -- Hume was right about that). Waxman provocatively suggests that in order for the metaphysical deduction to provide us with a concept of a necessary connection between distinct items (think of fire and smoke, rather than of a mountain and a valley), the "pure" (or "unschematized") categories are insufficient -- we require also some "sensible manifold" and its synthesis in imagination. Apparently, Waxman thinks that the pure categories, originating as they do with the logical forms of judgment, can generate only the idea of a necessary connection between conceptually connected items, not distinct ones. He is surely right in saying that Hume challenges the idea of a necessary connection between distinct items (an idea of a causal relation does not involve a relation of ideas). But his reading of the categories may require additional support. One might read the metaphysical deduction (and related remarks in the Schematism) as providing the idea of a necessary connection between distinct items, for it is the logical form of hypothetical judgment -- which concerns judgments of the form, "If there is perfect justice, obstinate evil will be punished" -- that gives rise to the concept of a cause, and judgments that take that logical form need not be analytic. Thus hypothetical judgments can certainly relate two conceptually distinct items -- say, the proposition, "The butter is in the sun," and the proposition, "The butter melts" -- to one another regardless of whether there is an analytic connection between the items. (There certainly could be such a connection: "If Socrates is human, then Socrates is mortal.") Thus we may not require the "sensible manifold" Waxman discusses.

The collection ends with Garrett's reaction to Waxman's discussion. In his very rich essay, Garrett tackles an often-ignored, but quite crucial, topic for anyone interested in Kant's reaction to Hume: if Hume does indeed follow Berkeley in denying that we have abstract ideas, then does he have any kind of representation akin to a Kantian concept (Begriff)? Can any Humean idea be a general, mediate representation of something (see the Enquiry, footnote 31)? Garrett provides a sophisticated discussion of Hume's thinking in this area. Hume thinks that while we lack the abstract idea, horse, we do have the following interrelated items: (1) 'horse', (2) many ideas of particular horses, and (3) an exemplar idea of a horse that serves to elicit all other ideas of particular horses that correspond to 'horse' (Garrett calls the set of particular ideas of horses the "revival set"). This is true for the idea of a cause as well. This helps to shine light on the motivations for Kant's metaphysical deduction: since Hume has successfully argued that we cannot obtain an idea of a cause from perceptual experience, and since Hume himself lacks a Kantian concept of a cause -- having only an exemplar idea and a correlative "revival set" of particular ideas -- Kant looks to the logical form of hypothetical judgment as an a priori source for the general, mediate representation -- the Kantian Begriff -- of a cause. Garrett then shows that as Hume redefines our concept of cause ("suitably" to our experience), there is a genuine sense in which there actually are causes, for there actually are objects that resemble one another, that are temporally contiguous, etc. So causal relations are not subjective per se -- only the idea of a necessary connection between causal elements is subjective, for we mistake a kind of subjective necessity for an objective one. This is a very helpful corrective to the characterization of Hume's analysis of causation found in some interpretations of Kant.

Many of the contributors to this volume are surely right to think that Kant was no historian of philosophy. The tradition was alive for Kant. When he read or pondered Leibniz or Hume, he was not approaching a canonical figure whose views had to be reconstructed within the appropriate historical and intellectual context. He did not ask: what did Leibniz or Hume really think? He asked: must I, too, believe what they believed? But in so doing, Kant set us our contemporary historical task, for he helped to shape our own conception of the canon. In that sense, Kant's relationship to the "early moderns" is an essential component of our own.