Kant and the Ethics of Humility

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Jeanine Grenberg, Kant and the Ethics of Humility, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 289 pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521846811.

Reviewed by Patrick Frierson, Whitman College


Jeanine Grenberg's Kant and the Ethics of Humility sets out to explain and defend a distinctively Kantian conception of humility as "that meta-attitude which constitutes the moral agent's proper perspective on herself as a dependent and corrupt but capable and dignified rational agent" (133). But Grenberg not only explains what humility might mean for Kant. She seeks, first, to defend Kant's notion of humility against contemporary accounts of (and objections to) humility as a virtue: "while the book is … guided by [Kant's] picture of humility … the overall intent is to defend philosophically the view that humility remains a virtue, and indeed a central virtue" (7). Secondly, Grenberg uses humility to illustrate how one might develop a robust Kantian virtue ethics (chs. 2-3). Grenberg challenges Kantians to give humility more prominence, and she shows how central moral categories that might seem too "thick" can play fundamental roles within a Kantian ethic (cf. 7, 80-103).

The book has four parts. In Part One, Grenberg discusses Kantian virtue in general to set up her discussion of humility in particular. Rather than attempting the futile and uninteresting task of showing that Kant is a strict virtue ethicist in the contemporary mold, she both amends details of Kant's moral theory and substantially challenges contemporary accounts of virtue. Nonetheless, the "Kantian account of virtue" that she develops is fundamentally Kantian and recognizably an ethic of virtue. In Part Two, Grenberg criticizes contemporary accounts of humility because their basis in self-other comparison dooms them to unhealthy accounts of humility as involving a sense of either superiority or inferiority. In Part Three, which is the core of the book, Grenberg lays out her Kantian account of humility (ch. 5), discusses the relationship between humility and self-respect (ch. 6), and sketches "the humble person" through an analysis of the character of Cordelia from Shakespeare's King Lear (ch. 7). Finally, in Part Four, Grenberg relates Kantian humility to duties to oneself (ch. 8) and to others (ch. 9). With the exception of Part Four, which leans heavily on previous sections, each part of the book would reward study even in isolation.

The first chapter, "Dependent and Corrupt Rational Agency," sets up the crucial components of the "picture of human nature" (16) that makes humility necessary. Grenberg defends both a "dependency thesis" -- the claim that "humans, to engage in the practical activity proper to them … must admit reliance upon persons and things external to them" (26) -- and a "corruption thesis" (hereafter, CT) -- "humans tend to value the self improperly relative to other objects of moral value" (43). The first claim is central within both contemporary virtue ethics -- cf., e.g., MacIntyre's Dependent Rational Animals -- and Kant's own ethics, as in Kant's argument for benevolence in Groundwork (4:423). The second claim is less well attended to in Kant -- it first arises in a significant way in Kant's Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason ¬≠and it is often ignored by neo-Kantian moral theorists -- and it conflicts with virtue-ethical accounts such as Aristotle's.[1] Moreover, CT raises particular problems for a contemporary account of humility, as the notion of corruption is often tied to "excessively self-flagellating accounts of sinful human nature" (17), accounts that Grenberg wants to avoid (cf. 166).

Grenberg's discussion of CT begins with a detailed scholarly discussion of "problems with current accounts of radical evil" (31, cf. 31-42), a discussion that deserves a place in the Kant scholarship on this subject. When she articulates her account of radical evil, however, she goes beyond mere commentary to defend the CT. As with much neo-Kantian ethics, she makes Kant "secular" and "gentler" (42), but her account ends up both Kantian and plausible. Moreover, in keeping with recent tendencies within moral theory and especially virtue ethics, Grenberg defends and articulates her view by applying it to literature, in particular, to Alyosha's failure to show generosity to Snegirev in Dostoevsky's Brother's Karamozov. Grenberg shows how Alysosha illustrates a moralistic failure of humility, a "tendency to find one's own projects, whatever they are (even the project of being generous to others), to be the most important thing" (47).

Grenberg spends chapters 2-3 laying out a program for Kantian virtue ethics based on this picture of human nature. In chapter 2, she argues for the important role of amelioration (in addition to excellence) in a Kantian account of virtue, she insists that "character, in the more traditional Aristotelian understanding of the term, does indeed matter in a Kantian account of virtue" (58), and she defends the unity of virtues (71-9). The emphasis on amelioration contrasts with Aristotelian approaches to virtue ethics, while Grenberg's account of character offers a contrast to many traditional Kantians. Grenberg explicitly adopts a hermeneutic that allows her to take some liberties with Kant's terminology, claiming that "if the connection to character and familiar concerns of virtue can be responsibly drawn on a Kantian approach to virtue, it should be so drawn" (71, cf. 81). The result is a virtue ethic that is Kantian, even if not strictly Kant's own.

As a Kantian, Grenberg prioritizes one's fundamental commitment to moral principles: "To be virtuous … is to have the capacity to control the course of one's inclinations by a considered judgment that moral principles present a source of value that trumps self-love" (80). But as a virtue ethicist, she also insists that character traits -- "settled pattern[s] of affective expression and rational endorsement" (82) -- matter in a fundamental way for moral life. Grenberg does not simply try to show how various virtues -- courage, temperance, etc. -- can be derived within Kant's ethics. She builds a Kantian virtue ethic from the ground up, laying out core rational commitments (87-8, cf. 144-50) and corresponding affective expressions (88-96, cf. 150-60) of Kant's ethics in a way that is distinctively Kantian but recognizably virtue-oriented. The result is a distinctive set of core Kantian virtues -- "a general respect for moral principles which is specified into humility toward self and respect for persons" (93) -- which can be connected with more traditional virtues. (Thus, for example, Grenberg shows how virtuous generosity in the case of Alyosha relates to humility.) By the end of Part One, Grenberg has not only laid the foundation for Kantian humility, but has provided a template for future work in Kantian virtue ethics.

Part Two offers criticisms of alternative contemporary accounts of humility. For offering an overview of current literature on humility, this chapter and related sections later (cf. 138-44, 166-70) are quite valuable. Grenberg criticizes those who ground humility in "self-other comparison" (111) because this leads to "inferiority" or "what is just as problematic, superiority" (112). Because "trying to engage in self-other comparison without an already existing humble perspective leaves the human agent trying to do so from an untutored dependent and corrupt perspective of misguided self-love" (115), "comparative judgments are thus inherently competitive judgments" (118) that "are forced to coalesce into a meta-attitude of either superiority or inferiority" (122). This argument explicitly depends upon Grenberg's account of corruption (113), which may make it less persuasive to others, and even with CT, Grenberg argues against alternative conceptions of humility in ways that she does not address with respect to her own. Given humans' tendency to subordinate morality to self-love, corruption seems as likely to prevent adequate Kantian humility as to infect comparisons with others, so if corruption makes comparative judgments inherently competitive, corruption is likely to prevent self-assessment from measuring up to any sort of humility.[2]

Part Three is the core of the book. For those wishing to get her basic account, chapters 1 and 5 offer the essence of Grenberg's view that Kantian humility is "that meta-attitude which constitutes the moral agent's proper perspective on herself as a dependent and corrupt but capable and dignified rational agent" (133). Against a (mostly religious) tradition of humility as self-deprecating, Grenberg insists upon recognition of one's capacity and dignity as intrinsic to virtuous humility. But against more recent philosophers who go to the opposite extreme, claiming that "the modest person needs to judge that she 'is far above most other human beings'" (6), Grenberg insists upon the importance of one's dependence and corruption. Chapter 5, which lays out this account of humility, begins with Grenberg's "guiding image" of humility: Cordelia from Shakespeare's King Lear (134-7). After criticism of contemporary accounts of humility (137-44), Grenberg offers a detailed analysis of humility that follows her general account of Kantian virtues as involving both rational judgments and corresponding affective expressions. She analyzes six key "humble judgments," including judgments like "(3) I am a dependent being with needs and desires who seeks happiness …" and "(5) All persons share the same capacity, dependence, and corrupt tendencies which I attribute to myself" (145). Grenberg then turns to an insightful, even if somewhat revisionary (154), analysis of respect for the moral law in which she isolates "four distinctive affective qualities" (152) that she associates with several of her humble judgments.

Chapter six, one of the more interesting chapters in the book, reintroduces the theme of the unity of the virtues, although now with a specific focus on the interdependence of humility and self-respect. Grenberg distinguishes between "awareness of limitation," which she calls humility1, awareness of one's worth qua agent, which she calls "self-respect," and proper humility, which is a combination of these two traits. This chapter is set up as a biconditional, in which Grenberg first argues that self-respect is a condition of (virtuous) humility1 and then that humility1 is a condition for (virtuous) self-respect. (Grenberg is not wholly consistent about whether each attitude is a condition for the other, or for the other being virtuous; she certainly wants to make the latter claim, and may want to make the former as well.) Equally importantly, she draws on Stephen Darwall's distinction between recognition respect and appraisal respect, using this as an opportunity to revisit her critiques of alternative accounts of humility. Grenberg argues that the self-respect intrinsic to humility must be a recognition self-respect in order to avoid problems with comparison and self-love that arose in chapter 4.

The last three chapters -- "The humble person" (ch. 7), "The humble pursuit of self-knowledge" (ch. 8), and "The humble pursuit of respect for persons" (ch. 9) -- show the relationship between humility and other virtues. Chapter 7 is an overview of the humble person, focusing on the fact that "[s]uch a person will make a belief in the equality of persons a guiding value in her choice of actions" (193), but including a discussion of the role of moral exemplars. Chapter 8 turns to "humility's relation to the obligatory end of perfection of self" (217). This chapter offers an insightful discussion of the way that humble self-knowledge avoids extremes of self-flagellation and excessive self-congratulation. Unfortunately, Grenberg's focus on self-knowledge misses an opportunity to show how humility relates to duties of self-perfection more generally. Kant helpfully distinguishes duties of self-perfection into those that relate to human dependence (e.g., duties to oneself as an animal being (6:421f.) or duties to perfect natural perfections (6:444-6)), and those that relate to human corruption (e.g., the duty to increase moral perfection (6:446-7)). A more complete account of these virtues would have helped Grenberg show the comprehensiveness of humility and highlight the distinctive roles of dependence and corruption in humility. Finally, a very brief chapter 9 argues, again with reference to Alyosha and Snegirev, that humility is necessary in order to respond virtuously to others.

Grenberg succeeds, if not in "the rehabilitation of humility" (166), then at least in putting humility back in the running as a virtue of foremost importance. Moreover, she succeeds in illustrating, in concrete terms, just how effective Kant's moral theory can be as a theory of virtue. That said, the book is sufficiently original and provocative to raise some significant concerns, and in the rest of this review, I focus on one such concern. Starting with her initial explanation of the Corruption Thesis, Grenberg fails to sufficiently distinguish human corruption from human dependence. Although they are ostensibly two different features of human beings, Grenberg's explicit account of corruption and her use of corruption throughout the book ultimately erode the full distinction between them, leaving her account of humility less nuanced than it could be.

Grenberg's deflation of human corruption begins with her explicit positioning of her own view of radical evil in juxtaposition to recent accounts by Henry Allison and Allen Wood. Grenberg rightly points out the danger that Wood, by overly prioritizing the social dimension of radical evil, can seem to "undermin[e] individual responsibility" (35). Unlike Wood, then, Grenberg wants to make radical evil an individual corruption with social consequences, rather than fundamentally social. This pushes her closer to Allison, but Grenberg agrees with Wood "that it is not the simple fact of being desiring beings that accounts for radical evil" (42). She hopes thereby to avoid Wood's charge that radical evil in Allison is little more than "a trivial practical corollary of our finitude" (32). Grenberg argues that corruption is explained "not simply by the fact that one is a desiring being, but rather by the fact that our desire points toward our pursuit of happiness in the fact of a lack of Stoic self-sufficiency, and this explains how the finite being is primed for choosing self-conceit and the resulting games of unsocial sociability" (42).

The problem, however, is that although dependence may imply corruption in a less direct way for Grenberg than for Allison, she nonetheless agrees with Allison that "it is not possible for finite beings spontaneously to prefer the demands of morality to their own pursuit of happiness" (42). Unfortunately, this admission of impossibility raises the same sort of concerns about individual responsibility as Wood's social account. Although Grenberg worries about "undermining individual responsibility" in Wood's account and emphasizes the role of choosing in her own, she still sees corruption as "inevitable" (42, cf. 38) or "unavoidable" (22), something that it "is not possible" (42) and in fact is "literally impossible" (78) to avoid. Given Kant's conviction that ought implies can, the literal impossibility of finite agents refraining from corruption seems to compromise the responsibility for evil implied by Kant's claim that radical evil is "acquired, or … brought by the human being upon himself" (Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, 6:29) and "imputable" 6:37).

More importantly for articulating the specific nature of humility, the fact that corruption (for Grenberg) is an inevitable and unavoidable consequence of human dependence leads to a conflation of these two aspects of human agency throughout the book. For example, Grenberg's "guiding image" of humility, Cordelia, seems eminently aware of her limits, the extent to which she cannot love beyond love, and her shared humanity with her father. But at least on Grenberg's reconstruction of Cordelia, the conviction that Cordelia is corrupt through her own fault seems to play no role in her self-assessment. And elsewhere in the book, Grenberg seems to reduce corruption to a "weakness" (114) or merely part of one's "agent limits" (174). Given the necessary connection between finite agency and corruption, these reductions are appropriate, but this hardly seems to be the corruption that Kant describes as "radical evil" and that Grenberg insists must remain "offensive" precisely to avoid being too "weak" (48).

The failure to clearly distinguish corruption from dependence, and in particular the failure to recognize that corruption is a universal but contingent fact about human agency, also leads Grenberg to overstate the importance of corruption. In her discussion of "constraints on any possible Kantian account of virtue" (49), Grenberg suggests that amelioration to counteract corruption is the most basic aspect of virtue. As she explains, "Any Kantian account of virtue must find its starting point in the acceptance of the Corruption Thesis" (49), and "whatever is virtuous for Kant is in some way a counteraction against human corruption" (73).[3] Grenberg rightly insists that Kantian ethics attends to corruption more than Aristotle's, and she rightly argues that Kantian virtue ethics should include ameliorative components. But she goes too far in claiming that these ameliorative components are fundamental to Kant's notion of virtue. Many of the virtues in Kant's Metaphysics of Morals are not linked with human corruption, and Kant's moral ideal of Christ is precisely an ideal virtuous human agent, free of corruption. It is crucial that Kant articulate a conception of virtue that is not corruption-dependent, precisely to make sense of why corruption is corruption. Without an ideal of perfect virtue, and in particular without an in-principle attainable ideal of perfect human virtue, it would not make sense for Kant to hold people morally guilty for corruption.

Even more dangerously, incorporating corruption into one's basic account of virtue tempts one to conclude, as Grenberg regretfully does, that perfect virtue is neither "a human possibility, nor ultimately a proper human standard" (78). While this is true of holiness, an adherence to the moral law that is not even tempted to stray, it is not true of moral perfection, a consistent adherence to the moral law that is tempted, but without any self-wrought tendency to give in to temptation. Moral perfection in this sense is and must remain a moral standard for human beings, even as we recognize with regret our inability to fulfill that standard (in finite time). An excellence-based account of virtue must be prior to an ameliorative one.[4] Clarifying the importantly different roles that dependence and corruption play in a Kantian virtue ethic would substantially improve Grenberg's overall account. [5]

Kant and the Ethics of Humility is an excellent book, one that should be taken seriously by Kant scholars, virtue ethicists, and contemporary moral philosophers generally. It offers a compelling example of Kantian virtue ethics in practice, one that can be a model for similar studies in the future. I raised some concerns, especially the need to distinguish more clearly corruption from dependence. One could raise other issues. Strict Kantians may challenge Grenberg's departures from Kant in her discussions of character and respect and in her secularization of Kant. Traditional Aristotelian virtue ethicists will find much to question in her Kantian accounts of the nature of virtues and of the core virtues of humility and respect. Grenberg's account of the unity of the virtues, and especially her use of it in the last four chapters of the book, raises particular issues about the sort of unity to which she is entitled (given her account in chapter 2). Alternative accounts of humility may find her objections in chapter 4 and elsewhere inadequate. But these concerns with the book are material for further discussion and refinement, rather than serious objections to the project as a whole. In the end, the book stands as a very good model of a new kind of neo-Kantian (virtue) ethics.

[1] As Grenberg points out, "Aristotle defends a picture of the human agent who is naturally drawn towards the good … [b]ut Kant defends a picture of the human agent subject to, and responsible for, a radical evil of her own making" (29).

[2] Grenberg admits as much on pp. 130 and 143.

[3] In her discussion of "amelioration vs. excellence" (49-55), Grenberg does at times suggest that there may be an aspect of virtue that pursues excellence without being ameliorative (50), but elsewhere (73) she is clear that all virtue is a response to corruption.

[4] That said, Grenberg is correct that Kant, unlike Aristotle, takes amelioration very seriously. As Kant explains in criticizing the Stoics,

Those valiant men mistook their enemy, who is not to be sought in the natural inclinations, which merely lack discipline and openly display themselves unconcealed to everyone's consciousness, but is rather as it were an invisible enemy, one who hides behind reason and hence all the more dangerous. They send forth wisdom against folly, which lets itself be deceived by inclinations merely because of carelessness, instead of summoning it against the malice (of the human heart) which secretly undermines the disposition with soul-corrupting principles. (6:57)

Too many virtue theorists, like the Stoics, underappreciate the corruption in human nature, and thus fail to build ameliorative virtues into their accounts. By drawing attention to the importance of these, Grenberg has done virtue ethicists as well as Kantians an important service. The issue raised by Grenberg's discussion of virtue, and by Kant's, is precisely what role human corruption should play in an account of virtue. Grenberg has argued, persuasively in my view, that a virtue ethics that ignores human corruption or that downplays how fundamental it is in human life is simply not true to human experience. I have suggested that Kant has an alternative to Grenberg's amelioration-centered virtue ethic, however. In any case, the issue of the nature and role of specifically ameliorative virtues in virtue ethics is one that deserves considerably more discussion, and Grenberg's treatment moves this discussion forward in a very fruitful way.

[5] There are several other areas (e.g., her account of the unity of the virtues on p. 71 and of respect on p. 154) where Grenberg ties specific claims to corruption, when they should be defended by reference merely to finitude. And elsewhere (e.g., a later discussion of the unity of the virtues on p. 76), she ascribes limitations to "finite agents" that are really limitations only for corrupt finite agents. But the most important place where this conflation raises problems is in the core account of virtue.