Kant and the Laws of Nature

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Michela Massimi and Angela Breitenbach (eds.), Kant and the Laws of Nature, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 288pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107120983.

Reviewed by Jessica Leech, King's College London


This is an excellent book that I expect to be extremely useful for anyone interested in Kant's views on necessity, nature, laws, and the natural sciences. I also believe it should be of interest to those working on current debates in these topics who wish to broaden their understanding of the history of these ideas. The book presents a range of philosophical work at the cutting edge, with many contributors engaging with recent work by others in the volume. For example, in chapter 1 Eric Watkins sets out a lucid account of Kant on laws in general, which is discussed by Karl Ameriks in chapter 2. In chapter 3 Paul Guyer presents his understanding of the systematicity of nature as a regulative ideal, and its relation to our knowledge of empirical laws of nature, whereupon in chapter 4 Hannah Ginsborg, in part in response to Guyer, presents her own view of the role that systematicity and purposiveness in nature play in our very ability to conceptualise the natural world. By the end of the book, one has a sense that one is up-to-date with several key questions, positions, debates, and developments of these topics of recent years.

The book has five parts: The Lawfulness of Nature, The Systematicity of Nature, Nomic Necessity and the Metaphysics of Nature, Laws in Physics, and Laws in Biology. Nevertheless, there are clear links between chapters in different parts, and indeed, the division between parts didn't always seem worthwhile to me. For example, Guyer's and Ginsborg's chapters are in different parts, despite their close links. This is not a criticism; merely a warning to readers that they should not be misled into thinking that all they need to know about, for example, systematicity, is to be found in Part II. Indeed, one of the most interesting and illuminating chapters is Angela Breitenbach's contribution (in Part V) on the laws of biology and how -- ultimately -- Kant's view on these is related to wide-scale and fundamental questions concerning the unity of nature and our place in it.

I will present a brief summary of the different chapters. I do not have space for a critical assessment of them all, but I will raise some of the issues that seemed most salient to me.

In chapter 1, Watkins argues that Kant has a univocal conception of law. Whilst laws can be practical, theoretical, a priori, empirical, constative, regulative, and so on, they all share the following features. A law is: (a) a necessary rule, that (b) is established by a spontaneous act. Watkins proposes to account for the variety of laws in terms of different kinds of necessity, different law-generating acts, and different faculties for performing those acts. For example, obligation, the faculty of reason, and the act of legislation, are taken to be distinctive of the moral law, whereas determination, the faculties of understanding and sensibility, and the act of prescription, are taken to be distinctive of empirical laws of nature.

In chapter 2, Ameriks unpacks a series of important but often overlooked distinctions amongst Kant's important notions of universality, necessity and law. This can be understood as groundwork for tackling a question of signal importance to Kantians, which might be put: Do features of mind ground universality, necessity and law, or it is universality, necessity and law that ground the nature and capacities of our minds? This connects to a concern that Ameriks raises for Watkins's account, namely, how to understand the crucial notion of the prescription of a law in a way that does not imply that we -- human-minded creatures -- literally create or make the laws of nature by prescribing them. Ameriks recommends that we understand 'prescription' in this context as meaning that something is, at least metaphorically, "written ahead of time", but not thereby literally created. In brief, we are not able to learn or to justify claims of necessity and lawfulness merely from empirical experience, and so in this sense reason must prescribe them itself. If the world is lawful, and we cannot learn of its lawfulness by experience alone, then reason's prescription of universality, necessity, and law is a condition of the intelligibility of the world and its lawfulness -- but it does not follow that reason literally injects lawfulness into the world.

Guyer (chapter 3) discusses a problem raised by Kant for our knowledge of empirical laws. According to Kant, a regulative ideal of the systematicity of nature is required for knowledge of particular causal laws. But this is a very demanding condition. Guyer contends that in arguing for the claim that 'we can know particular causal laws only as part of a system of such laws', Kant places 'substantive limits on our knowledge of nature' (53). Guyer thus claims that this is an importantly different problem from Hume's worry about induction, for whilst Hume's problem can supposedly be shrugged off at dinner time, forgotten at the backgammon table, and so on, Kant's is not so easily dismissed.

In chapter 4, Ginsborg picks up the thread of systematicity, asking: 'Why does the exercise of judgment require us to assume a priori that nature is systematic?' (72). One must find a genuine justification for the supposition that nature is systematic, not merely a reason why we (need to) postulate it, even if that postulation turns out to be mistaken. Where previous commentators have offered an answer in terms of the necessity of particular empirical laws (Guyer, Kitcher), Ginsborg gives a principle of systematicity a more fundamental role in our capacity to judge.

Ginsborg's approach proceeds via normative concerns. In brief, in his account of empirical conceptualisation -- conceptual sorting of objects -- Kant invokes the idea that such conceptual sorting must be appropriate to the objects. Next, given that we acquire empirical concepts from experience, we must be able to do at least some empirical concept sorting without a prior set of rules for how to do it: one is able to do something in a way that might appear to be rule-governed in the absence of a rule. Finally, these ideas are linked to the idea of a system of nature. Our practice of empirical conceptualization presupposes that nature is rule-governed and systematic. Together with the presupposition of normative fit, that 'nature ought to be, should be, or is meant to be judged by us in the ways in which we do in fact judge it,' (77) this requires that nature is, after all, itself suitably systematic.

Thomas Teufel (chapter 6) also discusses the transcendental role of the purposiveness of nature, and arrives at a similarly normative answer. Teufel argues that, for Kant, spontaneous synthesising activity presupposes the conceptualizability of the world -- 'that nature in fact exhibits a structure we can grasp' (119). Again, we might ask, what justifies us in the assumption that nature is, indeed, as we need it to be? Teufel answers: 'the possibility of object-determining syntheses (and, a fortiori, the possibility of human cognition as such) necessarily presupposes that nature exhibits at least a threshold of cognizable order' (126). Hence, if we are successful in cognition (as we may well assume that, at least sometimes, we are), then this confirms this order in nature.

The aim of chapter 5, by Rachel Zuckert, is to make sense of Kant's puzzling claim that we can never have knowledge of the soul, the world, and God, even though our ideas of these things have a positive epistemic role to play. Zuckert proposes to argue that 'that it is precisely as representations of unknowable objects, and as nearly empty, that the ideas are useful for scientific investigation on a Kantian view.' (89)

A question left open by Zuckert is how, precisely, to understand 'nearly empty'. She writes that nearly empty representations 'present us with mere aspirations, which are merely projected as objects' (90), and later, 'near emptiness' is glossed as 'thinness of their content' (106). But what should we take from this? Nearly empty ideas have no object; they lack a referent. They certainly have some content, but that content is at the same time 'thin' enough to (necessarily) fail to apply to any empirical object. One might be tempted to understand 'thin' as 'general' or 'non-specific', but that would seem to make it easier, not harder, for it to apply to empirical objects. Towards the end of the chapter, Zuckert suggests that, in fact, what is distinctive of the content is that we barely grasp it at all, for 'we have little conception of what we should claim, of what sort of property we should attribute to them [soul, God, etc.]' (106). So perhaps the ideas are not nearly-empty or thin in the sense that they lack detail, but rather we have only a tenuous or 'thin' grasp of them. That, in turn, would seem to suggest that there is more to grasp, if only we were able to. However, this doesn't fit well with Kant's account of these ideas as being generated by reason: for surely it can grasp its own ideas.

In chapter 7, James Messina distinguishes three interpretations of Kant on the laws of nature -- the Derivation Account, the Best System Interpretation, and the Necessitation Account -- and offers a defence of the Necessitation Account, according to which the laws of nature and their necessity arise from the nature of things. Messina draws out Kant's commitment to natures of things, and how these give rise to necessary rules -- laws of nature -- that guide their behaviour. Towards the end of the chapter, Messina grapples with a problem: what if these grounds of the laws are epistemically inaccessible, hampering our knowledge of the laws themselves? Messina's response is to distinguish between 'different types of a priori grounds of laws -- ones that are epistemically accessible to us and ones that are not' (146). However, there is, perhaps, an alternative, epistemically more optimistic, response worth exploring. Recent work in metaphysics (Demarest 2017, Kimpton-Nye 2017)[1] suggests that one can successfully combine an account of the source of natural necessity in the powers of things with a best-system interpretation of the laws: the laws arise from the best system describing the behaviour of nature as arising from the powers of natural objects. Perhaps a Best System Interpretation of the laws would make them more epistemically accessible to Kant, whilst incorporating Messina's account of the importance of the natures of things.

In chapter 8, Michela Massimi poses the question of how general, a priori laws of the understanding relate to the necessitation of particular events. Massimi proposes to attribute a kind of dispositional essentialism to Kant: things in nature have powers or dispositions that both flesh out the 'general template of cause-effect relation offered by the Second Analogy' (165) and ground particular manifestations of those powers.

I found Massimi's main proposal to be interesting, but some of her arguments difficult to follow. For example, she draws out some modal principles from Kant's remarks on 'ratio essendi'.

Ground of being <ratio essendi> is the ground of that which belongs to a thing considered according to its possibility, e.g., the three sides in the triangle are the ground of the three corners. (29:809)[2]

One claim that Massimi takes from this (and other) passage(s) is:

Given an essential property F that obtains in virtue of what it is to be x (qua ground of being), positing x metaphysically grounds the possibility of F. (158)

As it stands, I struggle to understand this. For example, I wasn't sure what Massimi meant by a property obtaining. We might rephrase the claim as follows: Suppose that x is essentially F, because it is true in virtue of what it is to be x that F. Then, x metaphysically grounds the possibility of x being F. For example, suppose that a triangle, t, is essentially three-cornered, because it is true in virtue of what it is to be t that it is three-cornered. Then t metaphysically grounds the possibility of t being three-cornered. If this is right, then it immediately seems strange. Didn't Kant suggest that it was t's having three sides that grounds having three corners, not t itself? Doesn't t's being a triangle imply the necessity of its being three-cornered, not the mere possibility?

On a different reading, the ground of being does not primarily ground a range of possibilities for a thing (although, insofar as the essential properties of a thing constrain its possibilities, it does so derivatively). Rather, the ground of being concerns what something must be like even to be possible. So it is not that if we posit a triangle, we thereby posit the mere possibility of having three corners; the triangle must have three corners, to be even possibly a triangle. This introduces a distinction akin to Aristotle's distinction between essence and property, according to which 'a property is something which does not indicate the essence of a thing, but yet belongs to that thing alone, and is predicated convertibly of it' (Topics, 102a1:18-19). Whilst anything with three corners is a triangle, and any triangle has three corners, having three corners is not of the essence of a triangle, but is grounded in what it is to be a triangle. We might then posit an alternative modal claim:

If all and only Fs are Gs, but not essentially Gs, then the essence of what it is to be an F metaphysically grounds that Fs are Gs.

Whether or not this claim is independently plausible, at least it leaves room for the essential properties of things to be powers, in line with Massimi's overall view, for there is nothing to say that the essences and properties involved could not be dispositional rather than categorical.

The next three chapters engage with the laws of physics. In chapter 9, Daniel Warren considers the metaphysics of force laws, and their relation to intensive and extensive magnitudes. In chapter 10, Michael Friedman considers the debt of Kant's conception of force to the Newtonian conception. In chapter 11, Marius Stan considers how best we might reconcile Kant's physics with classical mechanics. In the final chapter (13), Catherine Wilson presents an historical overview of the development of Kant's thinking on nature, from his pre-Critical essay Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens through to his work towards the end of his life.

I've already noted that Breitenbach's contribution (chapter 12) connects Kant's account of laws in biology with more general considerations of the unity of nature. One might worry that because, for Kant, biological organisms 'cannot be explained according to the laws that unify all material natural phenomena' (239), it follows that nature is not, after all, unified according to these laws. However, Breitenbach argues that the teleological principles which we need to explain organisms shed light on, rather than threaten, the unity of nature. For teleology allows us to focus our attention on organisms as a particularly interesting part of nature. As she puts the point, 'we are using a non-natural idea to guide reflection on a natural phenomenon.' (246) I found this chapter particularly interesting, for it shows how we may be able to find a place in the natural world for things that are best understood in terms of ends.

I hope these summaries indicate the thorough treatment that this book offers of Kant and the laws of nature. Inevitably, many questions are left open, and issues remain unresolved, but it is a thought-provoking and worthwhile read.

[1] Demarest, H. (2017) 'Powerful Properties, Powerless Laws'. In Jacobs, J. (ed.), Putting Powers To Work: Causal Powers In Contemporary Metaphysics (Oxford: Oxford University Press), 39–54; Kimpton-Nye, S. (2017) "Humean Laws in an unHumean World". In Journal of the American Philosophical Association 3 (2):129-147.

[2] Kant, I. Lectures on Metaphysics (Cambridge University Press, 1997).