Kant and the Meaning of Religion

Placeholder book cover

Terry F. Godlove, Kant and the Meaning of Religion, Columbia University Press, 2014, 245pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231170338.

Reviewed by Anthony N. Perovich, Hope College


Terry F. Godlove aims to exhibit the relevance of Kant to religion -- not, however, by considering the approach adopted in Religion Within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, but rather by turning to the Critique of Pure Reason, and even there concerning ourselves not so much with what it has to say about God and the soul as with its "basic purport" (2). The basic purport of the First Critique is found in its theory of knowledge, and above all in what Godlove presents as Kant's theory of concepts and, to a more limited extent, his non-conceptualism. Bringing these ideas to bear on religious issues yields a "humanizing" effect, making the study of religion very much an investigation of ourselves.

The book contains six chapters, each aiming to show how Kantian theory of knowledge offers useful guidance in treating one or another topic of significance to scholars of religion, although here only a few representative instances can be mentioned and the fine grain of its often complex and intriguing argumentation must be largely ignored. The first three chapters ("Concepts," "Definition," and "Reason") lay out Kant's theory of concepts and employ it to cast light on issues of essentialism and generalization as these manifest themselves in the context of the study of religion. According to this view, the extension of a concept consists not of a class of individuals but of the concept's sphere, metaphorically understood in a spatial sense (thus, the "spatial theory of concepts"): just as any space contains spatial parts within it, so any concept contains sub-concepts within it; just as there is no smallest space, so there is no lowest species; and just as points are not parts of space (because they are extensionless), so individuals are not parts of concepts.[1] Starting from the highest genus there thus proceeds a hierarchically nested and indefinitely extended series of sub-concepts. This involves a holism leading to an essentialism that applies to concepts -- the connections between concepts and sub-concepts are constitutive -- but not to objects. While we cannot pick out any essential properties of things (and so are unable to give real definitions), we are able to give nominal definitions ("explications" or "expositions") of empirical terms by assembling analytic judgments licensed, and indeed required, by the spatial theory of concepts.

The theory gets put to work in a variety of ways. For example, the concern that "religion" is a problematic concept because no one adheres to religion-in-general can be seen to be a misplaced worry: if we recognize specific religions, then the vision of a nested hierarchy compels us to acknowledge the genus to which they all belong. It also provides a framework that helps support nudging the study of religion in the direction of the social sciences. While Kant's definition of religion in terms of recognizing duties as divine commands has its own problems (duty involves freedom, which is not empirically observable), he is less subject to the charge that he has not provided it with necessary and sufficient conditions, as he is not attempting to provide real definitions but only expositions. These latter are always in principle revisable as no concept has secure boundaries; over time the informational terrain may come to be better mapped out (the terminology is Mark Wilson's). "And of course in due time the humanities and especially the social sciences did begin to step forward" (61).

Concepts can be tugged and pulled in new directions, and while there are limits on what is possible here, social scientists like Durkheim can plausibly be seen as dragging Kant's concept of religion into the sociological arena. Against those who are suspicious of the role played by generalization in the study of religion, the spatial theory of concepts provides the basis for a defense. In response to various authors who have been inclined to criticize the concepts of "religion" and "world religions" as merely intellectual constructions created by a reason obsessed with unity, Godlove responds that reason is obsessed with unity and all concepts are intellectual constructions. Problems arise simply when reason sets to work in the absence of legitimate lower-level generalizations. It is a consequence of the nested character of concepts (according to the spatial theory of concepts) that for us to apply concepts at all nature must exhibit a hierarchy of genus and species; that nature have such a character is demanded by the regulative principles in the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic. In an ingenious and illuminating discussion, Godlove aims to show that these principles make experience possible while neither possessing transcendental status nor being capable of proof, for there is no proof that nature will in fact exhibit the continuity required by the spatial theory of concepts. "What knowledge we have of material resemblance is always backward-looking, and depends on what we actually find in objects as inquiry proceeds" (88). While the treatment of regulative principles offered here is intrinsically interesting and persuasive, the amount of insight into matters concerning religion seems relatively slight when measured against the quantity of Kantian exegesis involved, and one wonders whether the results for religious studies might not have been achieved with less Kantian heavy lifting.

Following Wayne Proudfoot in focusing his discussion of religious experience on Schleiermacher,[2] Godlove aims for a somewhat more sympathetic reading by drawing on recent discussions of non-conceptual content in Kant.[3] The case for such content can be made by reference to space and time: because concepts involve generality, and space and time are individuals, the latter resist conceptual representation. This combined with the receptivity of our sensibility yields a sense of dependency along with an immediacy and independence from concepts that not only usher us into what Godlove calls Schleiermacher's "dialectical neighborhood" (107), but allow us to enter that neighborhood in the possession of tools that enable us to make sense of at least some of what Schleiermacher wants to say. Indeed, he concludes this chapter ("Experience") by pairing passages from Robert Adams on absolute dependence and Manley Thompson on the receptivity of the senses, which, he alleges, show "a deeply coincident diagnosis of our basic cognitive position in the world" (121). However, such a statement, along with the claim that his discussion culminates at a point where "it becomes difficult to distinguish between epistemological and religious reflection" (97), engenders expectations, or perhaps hopes, for more than Godlove delivers. The aim is clearly not to identify the non-conceptual religious encounter with our non-conceptual encounter with, say, space and time (for to do so would be to explicate Schleiermacher's feeling of absolute dependence in terms of Kantian non-conceptualism, and Godlove is explicit that he does not claim to do this), but to provide an analogous situation within the Kantian framework that enables us to give sense to what Schleiermacher has to say, particularly about absolute dependence. What Godlove then shows is that, when non-conceptual content is offered as part of a total Kantian package, the rest of the package severely limits the use to which the idea of non-conceptual content can be put: "the slightest deviation from the posture of philosophical anthropology threatens to bring transcendental illusion in its wake" (121).

Despite statements to the contrary, Schleiermacher seems to want to do more than merely elucidate the feeling of absolute dependence, but attempts to do more by, say, deriving the divine attributes, which fall afoul of basic Kantian strictures. The divine attributes go back for Schleiermacher to divine causation, yet precisely because it is non-conceptual the feeling is not technically experience, and causality is limited to what technically is experience. Of course anyone who takes religious experience seriously is unlikely to take "the rest of the Kantian package" as an unquestioned starting point. Yet Godlove does little either to explore the relevance of non-conceptual content to the analysis of religious experience independently of other Kantian presuppositions -- "experience" used here informally, not in the technical Kantian sense that requires the application of concepts -- or to make the case for the necessity of bringing the whole Kantian apparatus to bear on the interpretation of all experience, even of religious experience. I will return to the larger issue connected with this latter point below.

Some who find it most fruitful to regard religion as a social phenomenon are wary of the Kantian subject, which seems so isolated from social phenomena. Godlove believes that this worry can be put to rest by turning (in the chapter on "Self") to Kant's distinction between the self as the subject of thought and the self as an empirical object among other empirical objects. The former is not socially constituted and is too primordial for attempts like those of Robert Brandom to make the unity of apperception a social construction to succeed. The self as empirical object, on the other hand, "will encompass the full range of social phenomena implicated in the study of religion" (145). While Godlove throughout calls attention to what he regards as the "humanizing" consequences of Kant's approach, this feature comes to the fore above all in the final chapter ("Meaning"). It is a chief merit of Kant and his "humanizing" approach, according to Godlove, that he paves the way for the transition from the philosophy of religion to the social scientific and humanistic study of religion. After all, the "academic field called 'philosophy of religion' -- as much as invented by Kant in the Critique of Pure Reason -- has been in decline for some time" (6), but Kant has presented us with new and more fruitful ways to deal with religious concepts. (Godlove's claim here about the philosophy of religion becomes less jaw-dropping, but only slightly so, when he reveals what he takes to be its object, viz., "the eternal, infinite, omnipotent, wholly good God of classical theism" (6). This may help to explain his remark, but hardly to excuse it, as any serious consideration of the options has to admit more than what seem to be the alternatives he offers us: either the continued exploration of the traditional proofs of God's existence or the social scientific study of religion. This does, however, seem to indicate that for Godlove a bridge has already been crossed in the study of religion and that little effort need be expended in taking seriously what has been left behind.)

To appreciate the new vistas opened by Kant, we may take as an example the concept of God. He has positioned us to ask not about what the term in question refers to but rather about what its function is. For Kant, this "deflationary move" leads us to see that the function of the concept of God is to make possible human activities, activities to which we are in fact committed: God as transcendental ideal makes possible empirical inquiry, while God as practical postulate makes possible a moral life. Although Kant may exhibit some limitations in imagining functions for the concept of God to fulfill, he has opened the door to further functional interpretations:

Talk that had seemed to be about God turns out, on inspection, to be, literally, about us. Kant is inviting us to look beyond the bogus content of the concept at stake, and instead to ask after what it might yet be good for. A portentous invitation at the dawn of the social sciences. (160)

In light of such comments one becomes curious about the status of the Kantian ideas on offer here. Godlove's stated aim of establishing that Kant's "theory of knowledge bears on a range of religious questions and questions about religion" (6) might suggest a historical inquiry, one that modestly and neutrally explores the religious consequences of a number of Kantian ideas from the First Critique. Clearly, however, Godlove is interested in more than identifying what Kant might say about this or that topic: in Godlove's hands Kant becomes "an important resource for those who think regularly about religion" (11), a philosopher whose thought serves to put us on "the right track" (7, 14) when dealing with those many issues in the study of religion to which it applies. And there are indeed many genuinely illuminating discussions, especially in the early chapters' applications of Kant's theory of concepts to particular issues involving specifically religious concepts, but in the later discussions as well. However, the stakes seem larger here: as the blurb on the back cover puts it, Godlove aims "to redefine and reshape the contours of his discipline through a sustained reflection on Kant's so-called 'humanizing project.'" As the claims grow more controversial, however, questions about the legitimacy of the Kantian perspective, or at any rate its unrestricted application, become more pressing.

Many would not be surprised to find that "the basic purport" of the First Critique can be developed so as to set "up the migration from the philosophy of religion to its social scientific and humanistic study" (10), but their response might well be to doubt that the First Critique provides us with the best set of tools for addressing questions about God, in particular, and about religion, in general. One would expect that the way to deal with such concerns would be to come to Kant's defense by advancing arguments showing why the basic purport of Kant's theory of knowledge is forced on us so that we are compelled to deal with religious questions in its terms. After all, Kant becomes acceptable as a resource that will put us on the right track only if we are convinced that the conceptual framework he offers is both correct and provides the right tools for the task at hand. Here, however, Godlove is basically silent. Perhaps if one already knows in advance the destination one desires to reach, finding a mode of transport that services the route to precisely that terminus is a reassuring discovery. If, however, one seriously wonders whether that destination is where one needs or aims to go, it is surely not out of line to ask for good reasons that will justify being shuttled on board this particular vehicle.

[1] See Manley Thompson, "Unity, Plurality, and Totality as Kantian Categories," The Monist, vol. 72, no. 2, (April, 1989), 170 and n. 11 (186), the source from which Godlove's account is derived.

[2] See Wayne Proudfoot, Religious Experience (Berkeley, Los Angeles, and London: University of California Press, 1985).

[3] The editor's introduction in Kant and Non-Conceptual Content, ed. Dietmar H. Heidemann (London and New York: Routledge, 2013) provides useful orientation to, and the historical background, of this idea.