Kant and the Metaphysics of Causality

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Eric Watkins, Kant and the Metaphysics of Causality, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 464pp, $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521543614.

Reviewed by Frederick Rauscher, Michigan State University


Eric Watkins has turned the old Patchwork Thesis upside down (or, if you wish, right side-up). The Patchwork Thesis, made famous in Kant circles early in the twentieth century by Hans Vaihinger and Norman Kemp Smith, held that elements of Kant's pre-critical thought found their way into his mature Critique of Pure Reason. Watkins essentially agrees. The Patchwork Thesis further takes as its interpretive lesson that these pre-critical elements ought to be ignored and that the genuine "Kantian" philosophy must be drawn from the passages most recently written. Watkins could not disagree more. Instead he argues that the best way to understand Kant's mature philosophy is to read it in light of his pre-critical thought.

One can discern two strands to Watkins's strategy. The first, more interpretive, claim is that Kant's pre-critical metaphysics and ontology is retained in Kant's critical period. The new critical elements are all epistemological and metaphilosophical, but in reference to the same understanding of the nature of objects. "In short, Kant's world stays much the same, even if his account of the way that we can come to know it does not." (182). This first strand argues that Kant's First Critique in general and his theory of causation in particular can be understood best when read in light of the pre-critical metaphysics since the metaphysics is not only compatible with the critical epistemology and metaphilosophy, it is also required to understand many of Kant's arguments and positions. In this strand, Watkins largely succeeds.

The second strand makes the stronger claim that Kant in fact was justified in retaining the pre-critical metaphysics because it is a better explanation of causation than alternative, empiricist models. I will return to this claim later to show why I think it does not succeed.

The interpretive claim dominates the first two thirds of the book. In these first two parts, Watkins does a thorough job in explaining the pre-critical Kant's philosophical commitments and argues persuasively that the resulting conception of causation is retained in the critical period. Chapter One summarizes the debate in the first few decades of the eighteenth century in Germany between proponents of Leibniz's pre-established harmony (Wolff, Baumgarten, Meier) and the rival physical influx theory (Knutson, Crusius). Pre-established harmony held that substances, as independent, could not determine one another causally, for if they did they would not be independent of one another. Rather, all changes in determination of a substance must be caused from within it, and pre-arranged by God to fit compatibly with changes in all other substances. Watkins notes that even Leibniz's own followers altered his theory to allow for the possibility of physical influx and physical monads. Of particular interest in this chapter are the arguments from Kant's own teacher at the University in Königsberg, Martin Knutson, who argues that physical influx is actually required by Leibniz's own principles. In this rich chapter Watkins does a very good job not of only mining the original texts for their arguments but also reconstructing them in a way that shows their strong and weak points.

Chapter Two lays out Kant's pre-critical causal theory. Kant argues for physical influx, but not in the same form that Knutson had. If the grounds (the forces) of a substance are immutable, then its effects will be likewise unchanging. Immutable grounds thus cannot explain causal interaction in time. Change is possible only when one substance is altered by another substance, and hence change is relational among substances and impossible in a causally isolated substance. Kant further implies that substances that did not interact would be distinct worlds unto themselves. Most importantly Kant distinguishes between logical and real grounds. The former, which would explain causation according to a logically necessary connection between entities, would fall prey to Hume's objections to causation. The latter, then, must be the genuine explanation of causation. Kant was thus led to the search for the real grounds of causal interaction in the ability of a substance to alter another substance.

Part Two of the book turns to Kant's discussion of causation in the Critique of Pure Reason and other associated texts. Chapter Three centers on the Second and Third Analogies. The second analogy is read to argue not that a causal law linking two events is necessary in order to explain objective succession of those events but that a cause that contains the ground of the successive determinations must be presupposed. The second analogy is thus more metaphysical than epistemological in that it invokes the existence of substances with causally effective grounds. The third analogy fits Watkins's interpretation as well since it requires immediate interaction among substances, which can be well understood in terms of the real effect of causal forces.

Chapter Four broadens the discussion by invoking many other sources (Reflexionen, Lectures, other texts) for providing the essence of Kant's conception of causation (if you have time to read only one chapter in the book, this should be it): Hume's "event-event" causation is not what Kant has in mind in the second analogy, since it does not invoke the pre-critical metaphysics of causal powers of substances. Since the pre-critical Kant required the mutual interaction of substances for explanation of the unity of a world, "[i]t would thus be surprising if Kant were to attempt to develop a theory of causality in the Critical period that rejected his pre-Critical account entirely and invoked only events. In light of this fuller context, our expectation should rather be that it would be most natural for Kant to appeal to a model of causality that invoked substances, causal powers, and mutual interaction" (235-36). One of the most important sections of this chapter highlights Kant's use of the term "causality of the cause." Watkins properly stresses that Kant's causal terminology includes not simply "cause" and "effect" but also "causality", which denotes the cause's active power to generate the effect. A mere "event-event" causation would not include this term; a metaphysical "ground-effect" causation would.

The final part of the book applies the model of causation developed to other areas of Kantian scholarship. Chapter Five on Freedom presents a strong case for an ontological reading of Kant's solution to the Third Antinomy. Watkins carefully weighs the pros and cons of the "two-world" and "two-aspect" interpretations before he invokes the "grounding" of appearances by things in themselves in the solution to the third antinomy to side with the former, ontological one. The manner in which persons "in themselves" ground their appearances is in choosing their intelligible characters that result in particular psychological laws of behavior of the self in appearance; hence we contingently create our characters that then result in the necessity of some of the laws of nature.

If all this sounds very foreign to Hume's worries about causation, then I have explained Watkins well. It is foreign to Hume. Watkins devotes his final chapter to showing how Kant's model of causation was neither intended to nor succeeded in refuting Hume. First, he summarizes Hume's reception in Germany. No Germans took Hume's arguments as devastating, because they thought that Hume did not understand the nature of causation. Tetens did think that Hume brought up a legitimate point about causation, but offered his own quasi-empiricist solution. Kant's main response to Hume was to show that the "real ground" of causation could be explained. Watkins argues that Hume is not even the target in the second analogy. Kant instead offers a quite different model of causation as an alternative that does not have the problems of Hume's model.

At the beginning of this review I claimed that there are two strands in the book. So far I have concentrated on the first strand, one that offers an interpretation of Kant's conception of causation in light of his lingering pre-critical metaphysics. To sum up this aspect of the book: Watkins presents a detailed and well-defended interpretation of Kant's model of causation according to which Kant's metaphysics, developed in the pre-critical period but deliberately retained into the critical period, explains causation in terms of the active causal powers of substances, not mere event-event relations. Watkins defends his interpretation thoroughly in reference to Kant's predecessors and contemporaries and by citing many of Kant's own writings and course lectures. The book succeeds in making us rethink conceptions of Kant's theory of causation, his overall philosophical development, and his relation to Hume. One weakness that might cast a shadow of a doubt on the interpretation is that Watkins can find only one passage in the Second Analogy itself that explicitly endorses the model of an active ground of causality (251).

With that shadow of a doubt in mind, I move to the second strand of the book in which Watkins argues that this model of causation is not only the model Kant did use in the critical period, but that it is the model he ought to have used because it has philosophical benefits that the empiricist event-event model of causation lacks. In the final part of the final chapter, Watkins spends some time trying to show the philosophical advantages of Kant's model of causation for contemporary philosophy by noting how causation as activity can help to resolve disputes about the meaning of laws of nature and the possibility of an agent-centered conception of free will. These suggestions, however, are worthwhile only to the extent that the model of causation itself withstands philosophical scrutiny as the model Kant ought to have used.

Is this model of causation, then, compatible with Kant's critical epistemology and metaphilosophy? Or should the Patchwork Theory's general strategy of trying to eliminate such pre-critical remnants in Kant's mature philosophy be adopted? I am not convinced that the metaphysical model is better philosophically for the following reasons.

First, the model contains some instabilities that Watkins admits but minimizes. For instance, are the substances that possess these causal powers things in themselves or appearances? Certainly for the interpretation of the Third Antinomy to work, at least some of these causal powers must be things in themselves: the active powers of a self. This causal relationship is between things in themselves and appearance. Might Kant mean to identify all causally active substances as things in themselves? Such a model would be consistent with appearances as our representation of the unity of a world of things in themselves in reciprocal causal interaction, but Watkins rejects it (349f) and insists that Kant requires some substances to be appearance. But if some substances are appearance, another problem arises. A substance in appearance seems reducible to its spatial and temporal parts and can be seen as constituted by a series of events among those parts. In other words, it would be hard to find genuine substantial unity of an individual object with indivisible "powers" that cannot themselves be understood as merely effects of the arrangement of the parts in space and their alteration in time -- but this model returns us to event-event causality on this "lower" reductive level in appearance. To find the substances capable of having causal powers that cannot be reduced this way, one would have to move from explanation of appearances to the ground of those appearances as things in themselves. This move is exactly what Watkins rejected five sentences ago. Kant, of course, would not be satisfied with this explanation either, since he held that causation is the form of appearances (as a schematized category) even if also a property of things in themselves in their relation to appearances (but not known as such). Hence the instability: causal powers are invoked to explain causal relations among appearances but cannot themselves be explained as appearances.

Second, an ambiguity arises when asking what makes for the unity of the world of appearances. The pre-critical Kant held that causal interaction among substances joins them together into one world. But at one point Watkins notes that Kant attributes the unity of appearances to their being in one space (292). Indeed, in the Transcendental Aesthetic Kant implies that when an individual has experience of sensations, she must assign them to one and the same space. But then if genuine causal interaction is not necessary for the unity of the world of appearance, a strongly metaphysical model of causation that invokes the causal powers of substances and their ability to alter other substances is not needed, and a weaker model of causation that invokes only event-event relations could suffice on Kant's own grounds. Presented with a set of sensations that must be assigned to one space, a causal ordering of these sensations can result by invoking descriptive laws of nature and remaining agnostic about any actual powers of causality that might be a further cause of the unity of the world of appearances.

Neither of these concerns should bring us back to the Patchwork theory's complete rejection of everything pre-critical. Watkins has certainly shown that the pre-critical metaphysics that appears in the Critique of Pure Reason is not there due to Kant's own negligence. Watkins has presented a major work that presents an important aspect of Kant in a new light. I am not convinced that the model of causation attributed to Kant is the best Kant could have had, but I am convinced that it is one he probably did have, despite its flaws.