Kant and the Power of Imagination

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Jane Kneller, Kant and the Power of Imagination, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 172pp., $91.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521851435.

Reviewed by James Schmidt, Boston University


Kant tends to be viewed as one of the most stalwart defenders of the Enlightenment, Romantic writers like Novalis have long been cast in the role of the Enlightenment's most vigorous critics, and the relationship of German idealism to Kant's philosophy has always been troubled -- though Fichte saw himself as completing Kant's system, Kant rejected his efforts in no uncertain terms. Not the least of the virtues of Jane Kneller's fine study is that it unsettles the conventional picture of late eighteenth-century German thought by introducing readers to a Kant who had far more in common with Novalis and his colleagues than with Fichte and his. Along the way she explores the ambiguous function of the imagination in Kant's critical enterprise, untangles the philosophical commitments of the first generation of Romantics, and sheds a good deal of light on the extent to which the Jena Romantics might be seen as advancing at least some of the ideals associated with the Enlightenment.

Kneller reads Novalis' famous imperative "The world must be romanticized" as a continuation, rather than a rejection, of the program that Kant saw his critical philosophy as sharing with the broader aims of what he understood as the Enlightenment. She argues that interpretations of Novalis that see him as engaged solely in an effort to impart a more elevated meaning to the commonplace overlook his insistence that "romantic philosophy" required both "elevation and lowering": the ordinary becomes mysterious, but the mystical and the mysterious also had to be made "ordinary and familiar" (21-22). That Kneller finds parallels to Kant in the latter of these operations is, as she herself notes, "not too surprising" -- there is, after all, a long tradition of seeing Kant as engaged in a "deflationary" effort aimed at the "bringing down to earth, or naturalizing of metaphysical and previously mysterious notions" (22). What is less expected, and what the rest of the book explores, is the degree to which the first part of Novalis' project has affinities with significant aspects of Kant's thought. For Kneller, both Kant and the early Romantics share a commitment to the idea that there are strict limits to what human beings could know and a conviction that, nevertheless, there remains an "ineliminable, natural human drive to surpass those limitations" (27-28). The first of these commitments makes the early Romantics more faithful disciples of Kant than the first generation of German idealists. Unlike Fichte, who sought to construct his system on the basis of an analysis of the subject, Novalis and his colleagues shared Kant's doubts about the capacity of the subject to provide a complete account of itself (29-30, 33-34, 35-36). At the same time, they were also intrigued by the suggestion, sketched by Kant in the third Critique, that aesthetics might provide something more than an account of the category of "taste": it pointed the way towards "a theory of imagination as a creative force in human motivation and in nature" (36).

Over the next four chapters, Kneller explores the role of imagination in Kant's thought, beginning with a discussion of the place of the Critique of Judgment within the broader discussion of the idea of freedom in eighteenth-century political philosophy, ethics, and aesthetics. Kant, she notes, was unique among Enlightenment aesthetic theorists in his rejection of the "rationalist view that the ultimate purpose of art is the perfection of humanity" (45): he argued that aesthetic reflection was not subject to "the legislation of the understanding (i.e. to the categories)" and, as a result, is free from any "cognitive determination -- it does not involve predicating empirical concepts of the object" (43). It is likewise free of all "moral determination" since aesthetic reflection does not concern itself with the question of whether the objects it considers are morally good or whether they may promote moral virtues (43). Yet despite Kant's concern to distinguish aesthetic reflection from moral or cognitive judgments, the Critique of Judgment still held out the possibility that the freedom enjoyed by the imagination might offer something more than "a temporary respite from a morally hostile world":

Through imagination we are capable, in thought at least, of taking up what nature gives us and working it up into "another nature." As natural physical beings we are bound by laws of nature, as moral agents by the law of practical reason, but as imaginative creatures we are constrained by neither and thus have creative power. (52)

But though Kant's account of imaginative freedom suggests that the division between "the sensuous and moral aspects of human nature" is capable of being overcome, Kneller notes that Kant himself chose not to pursue this line of argument, perhaps because of the relative lack of attention given to artistic creation (as opposed to natural beauty) in the Critique of Judgment (55-56) or because of the emphasis placed on legal and constitutional structures in his philosophy of history (56-57). As a result, the exploration of the role that Kant's account of imaginative freedom might play in the domain of morality was left to Friedrich Schiller and his student Friedrich von Hardenberg -- who would secure his fame under the pen-name "Novalis."

The third chapter takes a closer look at Kant's aesthetic theory, focusing on analogies between the role of the category of "interest" in Kant's moral theory and his aesthetics. Kneller is concerned, in particular, with Kant's argument (in Section 42 of the Critique of Judgment) that the perception of beauty in nature carries with it a hint that the world displays "an orderliness that may be conducive to the state of justice that we morally desire." The moral significance of natural beauty resides in the sense that "nature outside me, because of what appears to be the rational orderliness and purposiveness of the object I am contemplating, may be suited to beings like myself" (64-65). This affinity between ethics and aesthetics has tended to be overlooked, as Kneller discusses at length in the fourth chapter, by those approaches that view Kant "as primarily an ethical theorist who subsumed all theory to practice" (72), a tendency shared both by "Kantian constructivists" (e.g., Onora O'Neill and Christine Korsgaard), who see Kant as giving a "methodological primacy" to practical reason (73-81), as well opponents of such approaches (e.g., Karl Ameriks and Richard Velkley), who argue for the primacy of practical reason on metaphysical grounds (82-87). Kneller maintains that such interpretations "fail to do justice to one of Kant's greatest insights, namely, that reason is a system of the interplay of both thinking and acting" (81), and are at odds with his awareness of "the danger of letting practical reason take over all aspects of human experience" (87).

Having examined how the Critique of Judgment hints at a closer connection between aesthetics and ethics than is generally supposed, Kneller concludes her examination of Kant's account of the imagination by considering some of the reasons behind Kant's misgivings about this peculiar faculty. While both Martin Heidegger and Dieter Henrich argue (though for rather different reasons) that, from the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason onwards, Kant sought to set limits on the role that the imagination played in his system, Kneller questions (drawing, in part, on suggestions by Gernot and Harmut Böhme) whether, in fact, "the imagination was entirely displaced in Kant's philosophy" (98). She notes that it continued to play a significant role in his account of the role of teleological judgment in the third Critique (99-104) and also occupied a prominent place -- in the form of some strangely positive comments about the role of "enthusiasts" (in his lectures on anthropology he observed, "Indeed, much that is good disappears from the land where they are purged") -- in Kant's later political thought (104-113). Extending these arguments, Kneller argues that Kant saw "the pleasure of disinterested metaphysical speculation -- i.e., the pleasure of doing metaphysics not in the service of morals or politics" as "a natural and perhaps even necessary mechanism for the advancement of humanity," a mechanism that played a role within the history of philosophy akin to that of "unsocial sociability" within the historical progress of the species: it functions as a sort of "unrational rationality" (115-118). Hence, while Kant never retreated from the insistence that "the Absolute itself" remains "off-limits" because it is beyond the capacities of human understanding, he nevertheless continued to insist that the "desire for metaphysical speculation is inevitable and unavoidable … . Reason seeks the unconditioned by its very nature. The danger is believing that one has found it" (117-119). But though Kant continued to be fascinated by the persistence with which the imagination sought to transcend the limits of the understanding, he was unwilling to grant this inherently unruly faculty "a status equal to that of the 'law-governed' branches of human experience" (120). That step was left for the first generation of Romantics and it is to their thought that Kneller turns in the final two chapters of her book.

Chapter 6 contrasts the philosophical projects of Novalis and Hölderlin with those of Fichte and Kant and argues that though Novalis and Hölderlin searched for a way to overcome the division that Kant's philosophy had opened between nature and freedom, they were strongly critical of Fichte's project of providing "a unified systematic account of the self based on a single basic principle of consciousness" (123). As a result, even as they sought to overcome what they saw as shortcomings in Kant's thought, they both wound up developing conceptions of the subject that were "far more in the spirit of Kant than of Fichte" (124). In his Fichte Studies (a manuscript, dating from 1795, portions of which have recently been translated by Kneller[1]) Novalis rejected Fichte's argument that the original act of self-positing that formed the foundation of his system was immediately present to the reflecting subject as an "intellectual intuition." Indeed, Novalis was willing to dispense entirely with the hope of finding an absolute ground on which a system might be constructed and instead sought to base his own system on the presence of a "drive to philosophize" that can never be satisfied (130). For his part, Hölderlin argued that, to the extent that anything approximating the self-knowledge that Fichte was seeking is possible, it would have to be articulated through an analysis of the experience of beauty -- an analysis that bears a striking resemblance to Kant's reflections on the nature of the sublime (132-134).

The book's final chapter takes stock of the relationship between Kant and Novalis, arguing that they were as one in the conviction that a "longing and striving for the absolute, the unconditioned, was an essential characteristic of human reason that neither could nor should be entirely suppressed" but that actual knowledge of such an absolute could never be achieved. They regarded those who -- like Fichte -- claimed to have secured such knowledge as victims of "transcendent delusions" (159-160). What differentiated them, Kneller argues, was the stance they took towards their recognition of the limits of human reason. Kant was "relatively sanguine", while Novalis was less so: hence his persistence in pursuing the implications of Kant's account of the imagination along lines that Kant left unexplored. In a final illustration of one of the places where Kant anticipated arguments that would be pursued, with fewer inhibitions, by the Romantics, Kneller provides a fascinating analysis of Kant's account, in his lectures on anthropology, of what he termed "obscure representations," i.e., ideas that are unconscious. Given the limited attention he devotes to particular works of art and his more general lack of interest in music, the example Kant used is an unusual one: an organist playing a "free fantasia" (152-7). Works in the stylus phantasticus were among the eighteenth century's least orderly and rule-governed musical compositions and relied on improvisational elements that resisted notation. Kneller notes that Kant's discussion of what is required of performers of such works bears a striking resemblance to his account, in the Critique of Judgment, of the nature of "genius" -- which he defined as "the innate mental predisposition through which nature gives the rule to art" (Critique of Judgment §46). The performer of a free fantasia functions as "a kind of natural phenomenon," exhibiting at the keyboard that same "purposive purposelessness" that Kant found in nature (154). In the act of improvisation, the musician "is not a 'conscious' artist": imagination takes the lead (157-158).

The resemblance between Kant's account of the "unconscious ideation" that guides the performer of the fantasia and the discussion of the mental capacities that constitute "genius" in the Critique of Judgment points, in Kneller's view, to a capacity that all human beings share: "the ability to produce aesthetic ideas -- 'inner intuitions to which no concept can be completely adequate.'" This ability, she argues, offers a possibility of "surpassing nature" and entering into "a realm of what ought to be as opposed to what is." Read in this way, Kant would seem to be suggesting that aesthetic imagination provides a means of projecting "the possibility of creating the highest good -- happiness commensurate with virtue on earth" (158-9). Kneller is too careful a reader of Kant to maintain that this reading was, in fact, what Kant had in mind and she admits that what she is proposing is "a view that Kant himself didn't adopt, but perhaps should have" (158). Kneller's "perhaps" betrays an ambivalence about the systematic implications of the broader argument she is making that may be shared by at least some of her readers: those who harbor doubts as to whether the lack of assurances that happiness and virtue are capable of coinciding takes much away from Kant's moral philosophy may have difficulties in seeing the need for finding remedies for this lack in the workings of the imagination. But there can be no question about the importance of Kneller's work in clarifying how Novalis and others of his generation -- who took very seriously the problem of the split that Kant was seen as having opened between the domains of nature and freedom -- read Kant. The first generation of German Romantics have, for much too long, been consigned to the ranks of the so-called "Counter-Enlightenment." The great virtue of Kneller's study is that it helps us to see how they could have regarded themselves, for better or worse, simply as good Kantians.

[1] Novalis, Fichte Studies, edited and translated by Jane Kneller (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).