Kant and the Promise of Rhetoric

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Scott R. Stroud, Kant and the Promise of Rhetoric, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2014, 274pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271064192.

Reviewed by Melissa Zinkin, Binghamton University


In the Critique of the Power of Judgment, Kant says that both rhetoric and poetry are products of beautiful art (5:305). However, Kant values these products of art quite differently. He writes:

Rhetoric, insofar as by that is meant the art of persuasion, i.e. of deceiving by means of beautiful illusion (as an ars oratoria), and not merely skill in speaking (eloquence and style), is a dialectic, which borrows from the art of poetry only as much as to win minds over to the advantage of the speaker before they can judge and to rob them of their freedom: thus it cannot be recommended either for the courtroom or for the pulpit . . . (Rhetoric) bring(s) to bear the machinery of persuasion, which, since it can also be used for glossing over or concealing vice and error, can never entirely eradicate the deep seated suspicion of artful trickery. In poetry, everything proceeds honestly and uprightly. It declares that it will conduct a merely entertaining play with the imagination, and indeed concerning form, in concord with the laws of the understanding and does not demand that the understanding be deceived and embroiled through sensible presentation. (5:327)

Rhetoric, as the art of persuasion, is deceitful since it creates a beautiful illusion that glosses over vice and error. Poetry, by contrast, is honest and upright since it is open about the fact that it aims to conduct an entertaining play. For Kant, rhetoric pretends to the truth while really being deceitful, whereas poetry admits to being a mere play while really furthering the purposive occupation of the understanding (see 5:321).

It is therefore somewhat striking to find a book entitled Kant and the Promise of Rhetoric. If, for Kant, rhetoric, in the sense of the art of persuasion, is deceitful, then how could rhetoric be promising for Kant? Scott R. Stroud argues that, despite what Kant explicitly says about rhetoric, there can be found in his texts another, broader sense of rhetoric that indeed has "promise" for Kant's project of the moral improvement of man and the formation of an ideal human community. According to Stroud, much of Kant's moral philosophy endorses "a use for communicative means to move people toward the virtuous" (13). Stroud's aim is therefore to show the role that rhetoric, understood as "human communicative practices oriented toward persuasion, belief formation, and actional change" (7), plays in Kant's moral philosophy.

I think the basic philosophical question Stroud is asking in his book is: are there some forms of rhetoric that can be used for the good? Is there such a thing as "skillful communication that moves people in a non-manipulative fashion" (41)? He thinks that Kant answers this question in the affirmative and therefore that Kant provides a resource for studies in rhetoric.

Stroud makes his case by first emphasizing that Kant, as in the quotation above, does not only consider rhetoric to be oration, the art of persuading, but also considers it to be a "skill in speaking (eloquence and style)." It is this form of rhetoric, as skillful speech and eloquence, that Stroud thinks has potential as a non-manipulative form of communication. Thus, whereas Kant writes that all persuasion is mere semblance and that what we are persuaded is true cannot be communicated (A820/B848), Stroud wants to show that Kant nevertheless has a non-deceitful and non-coercive concept of verbal communication that can be used to create "better agents and communities" (59).

In the first two chapters, Stroud gives an overview of Kant's view of rhetoric and carves out a space for a Kantian account of skillful communication that is not deceitful. In the remaining four chapters, he makes his case for a Kantian form of non-manipulative rhetoric that can help us to be moral. In Chapter 3, "Freedom, Coercion, and the Search for the Ideal Community," Stroud asks, "how can rhetoric exert an effective force to persuade others to morally improve themselves without being unallowable manipulation? How can rhetoric be effective and preserve and promote the autonomy of all involved?" (98). He argues that a non-manipulative form of communication is one in which the rhetors' intentions in communicating are not concealed (101).[1] In Stroud's view, in addition to everyday communications that are frank and open, there are also skillful and, indeed, "rhetorical" ways to communicate with others so that they can become better agents.

In Chapter 4, "Pedagogical Educative Rhetoric: Education, Rhetoric, and the Use of Example," Stroud argues that we can find an example of such non-manipulative rhetoric in Kant's writings on education, which endorse the use of a rhetorical means of persuasion that "encourage(s) individuals to freely pursue the path of self-discipline and cultivation that lies at the heart of Kant's moral system" (105). Educative rhetoric is "the directed use, often in educational or religious settings, of linguistic devices to show the real possibility and desirability of instantiating the moral disposition" (125). Of course, Kant's writings on education are for the most part concerned with the education of minors who are dependent on others for guidance (6:314). So it is not always clear whether this model can be truly non-manipulative when applied to adults. Still, Stroud's discussion of the role of examples in cultivating morality is interesting and insightful. He argues that "Kant's use of examples can show . . . that examples can function in moral argument . . . in a way that respects the internalism of moral motivation in Kant's ethics -- the moral agent acting in the right way out of respect for the moral law" (127). Stroud gives five implications of his account of the use of examples in his educative rhetoric. Examples serve to clarify a concept or a moral idea. By reflecting on an example, an agent can cultivate herself to take on the point of view represented by the example. Examples can move us since they can focus our attention on the value of rational agency and respect for the moral law, which, Stroud writes, are intrinsically motivating. Examples preserve and promote audience autonomy since they merely provide the occasion for the cultivation of a moral disposition and do not produce the moral disposition themselves; "internally motivating examples preserve and promote agential freedom by being an instance of those powers in action" (133). Finally, an educative rhetoric can be a model for a general account of rhetoric in Kant.

I think that Stroud is on to something promising in his discussion of how examples can move us to move ourselves and hence can be forms of persuasion that are non-manipulative. My own favorite reference for this is in the first part of Descartes' Discourse on the Method, where Descartes writes,

My present aim, then, is not to teach the method which everyone must follow in order to direct his reason correctly, but only to reveal how I have tried to direct my own . . . I am presenting this work only as a history, or if you prefer, a fable in which, among certain examples worthy of imitation, you will perhaps also find many others that it would be right not to follow; and so I hope it will be useful for some without being harmful to any, and that everyone will be grateful to me for my frankness. (AT VI:4)

It is, however, noteworthy here that the form that Descartes says his example takes is of a "fable." This may lead one to wonder why Stroud looks to Kant's view of rhetoric rather than his view of poetry as what can give us a non-coercive form of communication. For Kant, it is the poet who, in poetic play, provides nourishment to the understanding, in contrast to the orator who, along with the entertaining play of the imagination, hinders the purposive occupation of the understanding (5:327). Granted, Stroud makes a distinction between Kant's deceitful orator and the rhetor, who merely has skill in speaking. But one wonders why this is necessary when Kant already describes poetry as "honest" and "upright" and as being purposive for cognition (5:327). Perhaps this is because the model that Stroud has in mind is that of everyday non-playful verbal communication, so skill in speaking, rather than poetry, seems to describe the phenomenon in which he is interested. Nevertheless, as Descartes' own rhetoric in the passage above suggests -- for example, his elision of "history" and "fable" -- it is hard to determine whether even speech that is frank is not really manipulative and whether there can ever really be a pure form of open communication. These issues were the subject of much debate between philosophers such as Habermas and Derrida in the 1980's and 1990's. I would be interested to learn how Stroud sees his interpretation of Kant contributing to the tensions between reason and rhetoric raised by that discussion.

In Chapter 5, Stroud discusses what he calls "Religious Educative Rhetoric" and looks to Kant's account of religion and ritual as a rhetorical means of moral cultivation. He argues that Kant'sReligion Within the Bounds of Mere Reason "features rhetorical or communicative means to persuade people to choose the virtuous" (140). Stroud argues that certain forms of religious activity are, for Kant, "an effective and autonomy-preserving means of instilling the community-focused orientation sought in Kant's account of the kingdom of ends" (141). For example, the catechism that occurs in the church is a form of moral education. Religion, however, has a unique rhetorical force in its use of imagery and symbols. Stroud provides an interesting discussion of the rhetorical device of enargeia, the creation through language of a "vivid presentation" of an object for one's audience. He argues that in his Religion, Kant advocates the use of enargeia in the "ecclesiastical faiths," which are "the historical versions of the visible church progressing toward the invisible church," as a way to promote virtue (154-155). Stroud's discussion of Kant's view of the power of prayer is also valuable. He argues that for Kant prayer is "a vivid, powerful way to 'edify' one's inner disposition." Rather than being an act through which we beseech God to satisfy our needs, prayer can be understood to be an activity of self-persuasion (173).

In Chapter 6, "Critical Educative Rhetoric: Kant and the Demands of Critical Communication," Stroud extends his discussion of rhetoric to the realm of politics. Here, Stroud argues that for Kant non-manipulative rhetoric is reason giving (191) and that a general notion of Kant's critical rhetoric "is the use of language to convey and test reason-bearing utterances. Such activity is grounded on the idea of its participants as equally valuable and rational beings, per FHE" (203). Here, it seems that Stroud's project has shifted a bit. Rather than "finding" in Kant an interesting account of a non-manipulative form of rhetoric, he now seems to be applying Kant's moral philosophy to communicative practices in order to come up with what can be called a "Kantian rhetoric" but need not be anything Kant himself discusses in his texts. The critical rhetoric Stroud describes is what we would expect. It requires that we respect the autonomy of others when we communicate with them. Much of his discussion in this chapter now concerns what kind of rhetoric would not be permitted by Kant (211-212). Stroud does suggest that rhetoric can serve a moral function by encouraging us to think from the perspective of others. I would have liked to have read more about this since it would be an example of the kind of Kantian rhetoric Stroud wants to defend.

Since I am convinced of a Kantian approach to morality, I agree with Stroud that this form of morality should also apply to our communicative interactions with others. At issue here, however, is not rhetoric but Kant's moral philosophy, which would require many more pages to defend. What I found worthwhile about Stroud's book was the limited project of how, through rhetoric, a Kantian ideal of a moral community can be achieved. Although it is the case that from a moral perspective rhetoric is typically viewed negatively, it is certainly plausible that a skill in speaking should be considered to be something good or certainly better than a lack of skill. I therefore found valuable Stroud's provocative discussion of how, from a Kantian perspective, such a skill can be used for the good. I am still not certain, however, that skillful speech can promote morality in a way that is superior to speech that is ineloquent but frank.[2]

[1] I have argued for a similar point, namely, that there is implicit in Kant's categorical imperative a "publicity condition" which requires that we be open with our maxims of action. See my "Making the Ideal Real: Publicity and Morality in Kant," Kantian Review, forthcoming.

[2] But see here, Patrick Frierson, "The Moral Importance of Politeness in Kant's Anthropology," Kantian Review 9 (2005), 105 -- 127.