Kant and the Science of Logic: A Historical and Philosophical Reconstruction

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Huaping Lu-Adler, Kant and the Science of Logic: A Historical and Philosophical Reconstruction, Oxford University Press, 2018, 244pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190907136.

Reviewed by Jill Vance Buroker, California State University, San Bernardino


In this book, Huaping Lu-Adler provides a detailed analysis of Kant's view that logic is a science, that is, a formal system of a priori rules of thought. This characterization is not surprising, but the complexity underlying it is. To spell this out, she identifies four key questions to be answered. First, is logic a) a science, b) an instrument or organon for acquiring knowledge, c) a canon or standard for assessing reasoning, or d) some combination of these? Second, if logic is a science, what is its subject matter distinguishing it from other sciences? Third, if logic is necessary to all philosophy, on what principles is it based and how are they justified? And fourth, if logic is both a science and an instrument, what is the relation between these roles?

Lu-Adler places Kant in historical context (chapters 1-3), details his pre-Critical development to the idea of a transcendental logic (chapter 4), and ends by answering the four questions above with respect to Kant's Critical views (chapter 5). In her analysis she marks several distinctions, notably between pure vs. applied logic, general vs. particular logics, pure general vs. transcendental logic, and artificial vs. natural logic. Despite the (occasionally) exhausting details, Lu-Adler's account is clearly written and organized. Throughout, her discussion is enlightening and a solid corrective to the standard view that, from the 16th-19th centuries, philosophers had nothing interesting to say about logic.

Chapter one lays the foundation by discussing Kant's logical texts and the approaches to logic in the period he was writing. Most readers are aware that the views designated as Kant's 'Logic' are scattered through a number of texts. These include Kant's own lecture notes based on Meier's Auszug aus der Vernunftlehre; numerous Reflexionen passages, including his marginal notes to Meier's text; the Logic compiled by Jäsche; other transcripts of his lectures (Vorlesungen); and his own published remarks, including those in the Critique of Pure Reason. Given this variety, and the fact that Kant's lectures were subject to curricular constraints, Lu-Adler's first problem is to determine Kant's actual views. Among the reasons to doubt the accuracy of Jäsche's text is his position that Kant was not concerned with the grounding principles of logic. As Lu-Adler will show, this was precisely the basis of Kant's Critical distinction between pure general and transcendental logic and his position on the necessity of logic to all philosophy.

Lu-Adler then places Kant in the context of a methodological debate between eclectics and dogmatic sectarians. The former, represented by Christian Thomasias (1655-1728), valued intellectual autonomy and independence from tradition and prejudice. From the standpoint of dogmatic sectarians, the eclectic method was arbitrary and unsystematic. Christian Wolff's systematic method was often treated as dogmatic, given his idea that each science has an end that determines its a priori principles. Although Kant criticized Wolff's attempt to justify the principles of logic, he accepted Wolff's view that a science is a systematic whole having an a priori unity. In the Critique, Kant characterizes reason as progressing from dogmatic to skeptical to critical methods (A761/B789), mirroring the stages of growth from childhood to teenager to adult. Accordingly, Lu-Adler describes Kant's methodology as a "critical eclecticism," based on the idea that the fundamental principles of logic are grounded in the nature and limits of human capacities.

Chapter two surveys the history of views of logic from Aristotle up to the 16th century. One issue concerns the relation between logic and branches of philosophy such as metaphysics, ethics, and physics. Another is the subject matter and purpose of logic: if it is a theoretical science, how does it relate to rhetoric (or grammar) and dialectic? And of course the main question: what are the first principles on which logic is based, and how are they justified? To answer the skeptical dilemma concerning first principles -- either they cannot be demonstrated, or the attempt at demonstration results in an infinite regress -- Aristotle claims the principles of logic are learned by induction from experience. For him logic is a general theoretical science serving as a unique organon to acquiring knowledge. Aquinas adopts this view, identifying the subject matter of logic as the three acts of reason (actus rationis): conceiving, judging and inferring. Lu-Adler's survey ranges widely over the medieval period, touching on the views of Avicenna and al-Farabi, Peter Abelard, John of Salisbury, Walter Burley, William of Ockham, and others on the questions listed above. Based on their disagreements, she concludes that "logic never enjoyed a definitive, secure, or lasting position in philosophy." (66)

Chapter three examines Kant's immediate predecessors, who fall into two groups. Bacon and Locke share an empiricist "natural history" approach to logic and reject syllogistic logic as unfruitful. Unlike Locke, Bacon sees logic as an organon to acquire knowledge. Because syllogistic logic is based on haphazard principles and vulgar notions, such as substance, quality, and being, he argues for a new logic (Novum Organum) that will clear the mind of the prejudices and "idols" that corrupt reason. Locke agrees that logic is based on an analysis of natural reason, but he interprets that as a physiology of the mind developed inductively by reflection. His method treats the thinker as an independent agent who must regulate her own activities, in choosing how to direct the mind. Thus syllogistic and formal systems, although useful in some cases, are artificial tools that cannot help expand knowledge. Instead, making correct inferences depends on discerning the agreement of ideas and ordering them correctly. Both Bacon and Locke trace the errors of reasoning and mistaken philosophical systems to prejudices and undue influences. Although Kant rejects their empirical approach to reasoning, he accepts their view of errors of reasoning.

By contrast, Leibniz and Wolff base their positions on rationalist theories of innate reason, guaranteed by God's goodness. Because the texts we consider as containing Leibniz's logic were not published until the 20th century, Kant's knowledge of Leibniz was based on the New Essays. There Leibniz argues that syllogistic forms are simply well-ordered versions of laws of natural reason, which are preformed dispositions in the soul. Although Aristotle invented the syllogism as a formal device, a scientific method of demonstration, such as that exhibited in Euclidean geometry, can be extended to other sciences, including metaphysics and ethics. Wolff agrees that logic must have an a priori unity with demonstrable first principles, but he locates it differently in relation to philosophy. As Lu-Adler summarizes his position, it includes four theses, all of which Kant will reject: 1) artificial logic is a distinct representation of natural logic; 2) the principles of scientific logic are derived from ontology and psychology; 3) the part of logic that applies rules to extend knowledge in the sciences forms a "practical logic;" and 4) philosophical and mathematical methods are based on the syllogistic logic of certitude. (96-7) Lu-Adler wraps up this chapter by concluding that with respect to the grounding principles of logic, Bacon and Locke opt for natural reason, although Locke denies that syllogistic logic is universal. By contrast, Leibniz and Wolff attribute the principles of natural logic to the goodness of God. Regarding whether logic provides an organon, Locke rejects a universal logical tool, whereas Bacon seeks a new instrument, and Leibniz and Wolff envision a universal logic for all sciences. Finally, with respect to philosophy, Bacon, Leibniz and Wolff all give logic a pre-eminent role, while Locke considers formal logic unnecessary, although helpful in assisting human intellectual endeavors.

Chapter four treats Kant's thinking from the mid-1760s up to his conception of transcendental logic. As a student at Königsberg, Kant attended lectures by Martin Knutzen, who largely adopted Wolff's views, but distinguished general logic, consisting of norms of reasoning, from special logic, a study of errors in reasoning. Kant later recasts this distinction as pure vs. applied logic. Kant also adopts Wolff's notion of logic as a systematic science with apodictic certainty, but denies that its basic principles are derived from psychology or ontology. And early on Kant also rejects Wolff's view that logic serves as an organon for acquiring knowledge, although it does function as a canon for assessing reasoning.

In the 1760s Kant was searching for a proper foundation for metaphysics. His conclusion that logic and metaphysics are distinct sciences with different subject matters leads to his distinction between logical and real uses of the understanding. In the Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, Kant separated the sensibility from the intellect; by 1772 he recognized that the main problem was to determine the source of intellectual elements of cognition. In his 1773 letter to Herz, Kant describes transcendental philosophy as both the system of a priori concepts of reason, and a critique explaining how these concepts apply to objects of experience. This leads to Kant's characterization of metaphysics as subjective insofar as it determines the boundaries of human cognition, as opposed to pure general logic, which is objective insofar as it identifies rules of reason independently of their relation to objects.

Chapter five answers the four questions outlined earlier: what is the subject matter of logic? What is its relation to metaphysics? Why can it not serve as an organon to further knowledge? And on what principles is it based as a science? This chapter alone is worth the price of the book. In answering these questions, Lu-Adler brings out many surprising aspects of Kant's familiar claim that "logic is the science of a priori principles of human reason," in particular illuminating the relation between Kant's and Aristotle's logics. There are too many details to recount here, but these are the highlights of her answers to the four questions. First, the subject matter of general logic is the understanding. Second, the separation between general logic and metaphysics (transcendental logic) depends on distinguishing necessary conditions for thinking abstracted from reference to an object, from those for thinking about objects of experience. Here she disagrees with Clinton Tolley's view that the formality of general logic consists in specifying rules of non-intentional thinking. This part of her discussion also marks several different notions of "formal" as well as ways in which logic is both objective and subjective. Third, logic cannot serve as an organon because, as the critique of reason demonstrates, the attempt to derive knowledge from the understanding alone leads to dialectical illusion. Fourth, in explaining Kant's critical view of the principles of logic, Lu-Adler enumerates various functions of logical rules: determining the possible forms of thought, evaluating thought (e.g., the PNC), uncovering the source of cognition, generating forms of thought, and defining the objective validity of thought. Finally, she offers an enlightening analysis of Kant's view of Aristotelian logic, and specifically his claim that Aristotle's logic is "complete." She makes a convincing case that Kant is actually reconstructing Aristotelian logic, just as his table of categories reconstructs Aristotle's mistaken theory of categorial concepts.

Despite her clear writing, Lu-Adler's text is not easy reading because of the detailed nature of her discussion, and in particular her many distinctions. But the book sets a high standard for future discussions of Kant's views of logic and its relation to philosophy. Anyone interested in Kant or the history and philosophy of logic will find this worth the effort.