Kant, God and Metaphysics: The Secret Thorn

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Edward Kanterian, Kant, God and Metaphysics: The Secret Thorn, Routledge, 2018, 444pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138908581.

Reviewed by Michael Rohlf, Catholic University of America


This book analyzes Kant's pre-critical writings on metaphysics up to around 1769, paying particular attention to religious themes and placing these works in the context of Reformation and early modern Protestant theology and its influence on philosophy in that period. The book's subtitle, "The Secret Thorn," is taken from Heidegger's claim that "for Kant the question as to whether and how and within which limits the proposition 'God exists' is possible . . . is the secret thorn that drives all thinking in the Critique of Pure Reason and subsequent works" (Heidegger 1976: 449. Quoted at xv). Kanterian subjects Kant's pre-critical works to this line of interpretation, which is not unique to Heidegger but somewhat common among scholars on the continent, particularly in Germany, though it is uncommon in Anglophone Kant studies.

Kanterian therefore presents this book as a corrective to what he regards as a sanitized picture of Kant's metaphysics and its development that predominates in Anglophone philosophy (perhaps in part due to its Marburg School neo-Kantian heritage), according to which religious factors are not primary influences on or themes in Kant's metaphysical thought, whose central core is rather at least primarily philosophical and scientific. This sanitized picture of Kant gets things precisely backwards, for Kanterian: in fact, Kant's metaphysics has a "doctrinal religious core, more or less stable since Luther" and accepted by Kant throughout the pre-critical and into the critical periods, during which time Kant cycles through "various ontological, epistemological, and methodological positions," which are merely "the auxiliary part of [his] defensive project" (325). In other words, Kant's philosophical project is essentially a form of Lutheran apologetics (158, 235, but note also 1), and the metaphysics he famously struggles to reform constitutes only the outer, auxiliary part of his system, while its inner, religious core remains constant until at least near the end of Kant's life. The reason Kant changes his mind about the auxiliary elements of metaphysics at various times throughout the pre-critical period, up to and including the critical turn, is primarily that he gradually but repeatedly comes to recognize the inadequacy of his earlier positions for defending his faith.

In this review I focus on some of the evidence and arguments Kanterian marshals in support of this reading of Kant. But it should be emphasized that this book is extraordinarily rich and useful even if one remains unconvinced by its main thesis. The book contains extremely detailed discussions and often trenchant criticisms of nearly all Kant's pre-critical writings concerned with metaphysics -- much more, in fact, than is necessary to develop and defend its main thesis. It reads like an extended commentary on Kant's major pre-critical works that refuses to choose between either understanding Kant's texts in their historical context or evaluating the strengths and weaknesses of their arguments from our twenty-first century vantage point. Kanterian does both superlatively well, and in that respect his book should take its place alongside other major studies of Kant's pre-critical development in English such as Laywine (1994) and Schönfeld (2000), not to mention Kuehn's biography (2001). Moreover, readers with a particular interest in religious themes in Kant's pre-critical philosophy will find here an exhaustive presentation and discussion of not only published texts related to those themes but also unpublished Reflexionen and letters.

The book begins with a long and largely freestanding chapter summarizing the religious background to Kant's age, organized in

four concentric circles, discussing first the problem of the certainty of salvation after the Protestant revolution, second the development of a corresponding metaphysical and theological [Lutheran] orthodoxy, third the rise of the new science and its philosophy, and fourth the triumph and peril of reason in the Enlightenment. (2)

Although Kanterian relies heavily on secondary sources in this chapter, it is a marvelous summary with which to begin a book on the religious roots of Kant's metaphysics. It turns out, however, to be only loosely connected with the rest of the book, except to the extent that it provides context for occasional comparisons between Kant and other figures in later chapters, and it introduces the central motif of weakness that Kanterian finds running through the Protestant tradition from Luther to Kant. He explains: "Despair, based on the realisation of one's weakness, followed by trust and the feeling of safety, are essential components of the spiritual structure or movement described [by Luther and Zwingli]. They will be present in Kant's thought as well" (7. See also 113f., 127f., and 390).

Chapter two discusses Kant's early works Living Forces (1747), Universal Natural History (1755), and New Elucidation (1755), while chapter three discusses Physical Monadology (1756) and other works preceding The Only Possible Ground (1763), which is discussed in chapter four. Kanterian presents The Only Possible Ground as the centerpiece of Kant's pre-critical project, "the first fortress" Kant built in defense of his religious faith, "the most important, systematic, far-ranging and ambitious of his works so far, indeed of anything he was to write prior to the first Critique" (190). Chapter four is thus the centerpiece of Kanterian's book as well. Chapter five, entitled "First cracks in the wall," then discusses the Prize Essay (written in 1762 but published in 1764), Negative Magnitudes (1763), and Kant's 1762-64 lectures on metaphysics; and chapter six turns to Observations (1764), Kant's remarks on Observations (probably before 1766), Dreams (1766), and other writings from the mid-1760s. These two chapters detail Kant's reasons for coming to regard his "first fortress" as unsound, his increasingly intense attacks on the type of (auxiliary) metaphysics he developed in The Only Possible Ground, and the rise to prominence of moral themes in Kant's writings. Kanterian portrays this period as involving a deepening of the weakness motif in Kant's thought, which ultimately leads him not to abandon his defensive project but only to adopt a new strategy:

One of Kant's philosophical aims was to build a metaphysical fortress for his articles of faith, i.e. to defend faith through knowledge. But realising the extent of the cognitive human weakness, he became increasingly sceptical about this project. It then gradually dawned upon him that he can and needs to defend faith through ignorance. The critical turn appears in a new light with this shift from knowledge to ignorance in mind. (312)

Chapter seven then looks at Reflexionen from the 1760s for evidence that Kant remained interested in theological metaphysics during this entire period, and that the critical turn itself has religious significance in Kant's thinking. The book concludes with an epilogue gesturing at how "the modern drama of religion" that Kanterian finds playing itself out in Kant's pre-critical period also continues to the end of Kant's life.

Let us return to Kant's earliest works. Both Living Forces and Universal Natural History are primarily scientific works, but as Kanterian emphasizes Universal Natural History also contains a physico-theology and many passages expressing religious confidence and enthusiasm: "Kant expresses his awe for the wisdom and beauty of God's creation, his faith in the eschatological progress of the universe, and his awareness of the humble place of man in the grand scheme of things" (97). Kant also explicitly aligns himself with the (broadly Leibnizian) project of reconciling science and religion (which for Kant in 1755 means reconciling Newtonian physics and its consequences with various Leibnizian metaphysical and theological commitments):

the conviction about the infallibility of divine truths is so powerful to me that I would consider everything which contradicts them as fully refuted . . . But the agreement that I witness between my system and religion, raises my confidence vis-à-vis all difficulties to a level of fearless calm. (1:222. Quoted at 103)

What is the basis of Kant's religious conviction? One possibility is the physico-theology he articulates in the same work: Kant argues (again along broadly Leibnizian lines) that God's existence is proven not directly from observation of purpose and beauty in nature, but rather from the knowledge that such beauty and harmony proceeds from laws of nature, which are themselves beautiful and harmonious. But Kanterian both rejects this argument and denies that it is the basis of Kant's religious conviction: "Kant's religious confidence and enthusiasm are remarkable, although not matched by the cogency of his arguments. They are in fact rational fillers and articulations of undoubted presuppositions" (106, my emphasis). Later Kanterian cites Anselm in support of the generalization that

proofs of the existence of God . . . are hardly intended to make their authors accept a hitherto rejected belief (that God exists), but are constructed to strengthen beliefs already held, to spell them out (in the sense of 'faith seeking understanding') or to defend them against opponents. (115)

This seems unfair. Even if true, it would not show that Kant understands his own project in this way, for which Kanterian provides no convincing evidence from Universal Natural History itself. The more straightforward interpretation is that Kant understands the arguments he gives in that work to justify the religious faith he expresses there, even if in fact they do not, as Kant himself later realizes.

Universal Natural History was published in the same year as New Elucidation, which introduces a new modal argument for God's existence as the ground of all possibility. It may seem odd that Kanterian places The Only Possible Ground at the center of his account of Kant's pre-critical project while also claiming that the modal argument it develops is essentially the same as the one in New Elucidation (193, 210). But what makes The Only Possible Ground Kant's "first fortress" on Kanterian's view is apparently that it combines both the modal argument and the physico-theological argument from Universal Natural History. (It is also Kant's only pre-critical work devoted primarily to rational theology). I do not have the space to discuss Kanterian's extremely detailed critical analysis of both arguments, especially the modal argument in The Only Possible Ground. Suffice it to say that he eviscerates both arguments, then draws the following conclusion:

neither proof in isolation, nor both of them in combination, really manage to live up to the conception of God Kant is committed to independently and prior to the formulation of these proofs. In this respect, Kant's attitude to God is reminiscent of Anselm and other thinkers raised in the Christian tradition. The existence of God, not to mention the intelligibility of his concept, is an unquestioned given, with rational theology premised on it. (268)

This is the same claim Kanterian made about Universal Natural History, in that case without convincing evidence. Does The Only Possible Ground offer better evidence for it?

Kanterian gives several reasons to think it does. First, Kant opens the work by denying that "the most important of all our cognitions, there is a God, would waver or be imperilled if it were not supported by deep metaphysical investigations" (2:65). Second, Kant emphasizes, as Kanterian explains, that "physico-theology makes a much greater impression on the human soul; its subjective certainty is greater than that of the abstract modal argument" (268), although "Kant admits that the physico-theological proof is logically much weaker than a priori proofs," especially the modal argument, to which Kant ascribes "mathematical certainty" (266). Third, Kanterian claims that physico-theology is not, however, the source of religious conviction either, which is rather what Kant calls "natural common sense" (268). I quote Kant from the Cambridge translation (1992):

It was not the will of Providence that the insights so necessary to our happiness should depend upon the sophistry of subtle inferences. On the contrary, Providence has directly transmitted these insights to our natural common sense. . . . Thus, that employment of sound reason, which still lies within the limits of ordinary insights, yields sufficiently convincing proofs of the existence and properties of this Being, though the subtle scholar will everywhere feel the lack of demonstration and of the exactitude of precisely determined concepts and regularly connected syllogisms. Nonetheless, once cannot refrain from searching for this demonstration, in the hope that it may present itself somewhere. . . . To achieve this purpose, however, one must venture the bottomless abyss of metaphysics. (2:65-66 at 111)

Fourth, although this passage (as well as 2:118) obviously refers to physico-theology, Kant also writes that

It is, perhaps, only since revelation has taught us the complete dependency of the world upon God that philosophy has also made the requisite effort to regard the origin of things themselves, which constitute the raw material of nature, as something not possible independently of an Author. (2:124 at 165)

Kanterian argues that these passages show the following:

The Only Possible Ground is written against the background of the assumed truth of scriptural revelation. This background is not addressed in the book, but it is presupposed, as 2:118 and 2:124 intimate. The metaphysical speculation of the modal argument is a secondary or even tertiary project, a fortress built to defend, in the loftier realm of philosophy, received faith. (251)

The secondary project is presumably physico-theology, which would not supply "the religious sentiment underlying Kant's philosophy" unless it were in turn underwritten by revelation (249).

I find these arguments unconvincing. As Kanterian seems to admit, Kant does not appeal to revelation as the basis of religious conviction, but only "to get us into thinking about the possibility of an actual creator, as opposed to a mere architect" (255), which possibility Kant says "natural common sense" investigates "within the limits of ordinary insights." Kant's view expressed in these passages is therefore the same as in Universal Natural History: namely, that physico-teleology is the basis of religious conviction all by itself. In The Only Possible Ground, however, Kant recognizes the logical weakness of physico-theology, but he argues that the modal argument remedies this weakness. So the overall thrust of the work is that physico-theology is the subjective basis of religious faith, which receives theoretical justification from the modal argument.

Again, Kant almost immediately pokes holes in the arguments of The Only Possible Ground. Kanterian convincingly shows both that central threads of the Prize Essay and of Negative Magnitudes undermine the modal argument, and that Kant does not seem to fully grasp this consequence in those works (291f., 302f.). This pushes Kant's full realization of the failure of his "first fortress" back to the mid-1760s, as reflected in the sceptical, anti-metaphysical tone of works such as Observations, Remarks on Observations, and especially Dreams. From this vantage point, Kanterian's interpretive thesis about Kant's earlier works through The Only Possible Ground seems to be not (only?) that Kant thought of his pre-critical project as apologetical -- which I do not think he convincingly shows -- but also (or rather?) that in fact religious faith is an unquestioned given for Kant, which both motivates his search for philosophical arguments in its defense and explains his adoption of weak arguments to that end.

To support this 'in fact' thesis, Kanterian cites Reflexionen from the mid-to-late-1760s showing that Kant remained interested in theological metaphysics even during his 'sceptical' period, when he no longer recognized any sort of theoretical argument as justifying belief in God but increasingly appealed instead to moral grounds in its support. So Kant's intellectual development has two main phases:

First, 'the force of conviction' is given to early Kant, in the 1755-1763 period, through a physico-theological awe that presupposes revealed faith. Second, in the critical phase this certainty shifts to the moral disposition, which now turns out to be the direct source of certainty . . . While 'the force of conviction' is still generated through awe, this is now done without a visible link to Christian revelation. (252)

It is noteworthy that Kanterian finds little textual evidence of Kant affirming a revelation-based faith, of the sort he easily produces in Crusius (311f. See also 356f.) and Kant's teacher Martin Knutzen (359f.). He discusses passages in Kant's Remarks on Observations addressing the use of scripture for moral improvement (320), as well as an obscure reference to "real documents" in R 3907 (350). But this thin textual evidence is overwhelmed by Kanterian's presentation of similarities between philosophical and theological themes in Kant's writings from the mid-to-late 1760s and those appearing in Kant's predecessors, including "Leibniz (in his controversy with Clarke), Bacon, Hobbes, Bayle, Collier, Crusius, Pascal, Hume, and also Martin Knutzen and F. A. Schultz" (352). Why does this not show that Kant's interest in religious themes during this period is due, not to his unquestioned acceptance of a revelation-based faith, but rather to his engagement (directly or indirectly) with these and others of his philosophical predecessors, in whose works these same themes figure prominently?

If Kanterian's thesis that God's existence is 'in fact' an undoubted presupposition for Kant means not only that Kant affirms this belief on the basis of bad arguments (as it seems to, e.g., at 266), but that he recognizes the inadequacy of these arguments while nevertheless continuing to affirm God's existence, then to defend this thesis Kanterian needs to show that Kant continued to affirm God's existence after recognizing the failure of the modal argument and before embracing a moral justification for this belief. But this is the weakest part of Kanterian's book: his chapter on the 'sceptical' period underestimates the depth of Kant's scepticism in the mid-1760s, especially in Dreams, and it does not establish a gap in time between Kant's recognition of the unsoundness of his 'first fortress' and his shift to a moral argument for God's existence.

I think Kanterian's book deserves much praise for showing the centrality of religious and theological themes in Kant's pre-critical works and generally in the debates in early modern metaphysics that Kant engaged with. But Kanterian goes too far in characterizing Kant, and for that matter also "Leibniz, Wolff, Baumgarten, and Crusius" (158) and (all?) "other thinkers raised in the Christian tradition" (268), as accepting God's existence (if indeed they do at all) as an unquestioned premise and engaging in fundamentally apologetical philosophical projects.


Heidegger, M. (1976), Wegmarken, Frankfurt: Klostermann.

Kant, I. (1992), Theoretical Philosophy, 1755-1770, ed. D. Walford, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kuehn, M. (2001), Kant: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Laywine, A. (1994), Kant's Early Metaphysics and the Origins of Critical Philosophy, Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview.

Schönfeld, M. (2000), The Philosophy of the Young Kant: The Precritical Project, Oxford: Oxford University Press.