Kant, Kantianism, and Idealism: The Origins of Continental Philosophy

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Thomas Nenon (ed.), Kant, Kantianism, and Idealism: The Origins of Continental Philosophy, 343pp., vol. 1 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by J. M. Fritzman, Lewis & Clark College


This is the first of eight volumes in the series The History of Continental Philosophy. In his introductory chapter, Thomas Nenon notes that, in contrast to analytic philosophy, continental philosophy developed through a deep and sustained dialogue with Kant's philosophy and those thinkers influenced by it in France and Germany during the nineteenth century. He is correct; Kant's philosophy begins its rehabilitation in analytic philosophy with the 1966 publications of Jonathan Bennett's Kant's Analytic and Peter Strawson's Bounds of Sense: An Essay on Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. He also observes that, although Kant's philosophy has now been appropriated by both analytic and continental philosophy, the other philosophers discussed in this book have generally been ignored in analytic philosophy.

Nenon writes that the French Revolution was taken by Kant to directly challenge two of the fundamental beliefs of the Enlightenment. The first belief was that enlightenment is compatible with order, stability, and the gradual reform of political and social institutions. The second was that progress in any one area of human endeavor would be mirrored by progress in other areas. Nenon suggests that there were two chief responses to this challenge. The "romantic view" of Fichte, the early Hegel, and Marx maintained that progress will result in the elimination of the state. The "realist position" of the later Hegel held that the rational state is not only required for progress but is itself an instance of that progress.

Following this introductory chapter, there are ten that discuss specific philosophers.

Nenon's "Immanuel Kant's Turn to Transcendental Philosophy" provides a discussion of Kant's development from his pre-critical to his critical philosophy, as well as summaries of his three critiques, his views on religion, history, and politics. This chapter is commendable for its ability to present such difficult material clearly and concisely.

Richard Fincham's "Kant's Early Critics: Jacobi, Reinhold, Maimon" initially situates these figures in the so-called "Pantheism Controversy." He explains how these philosophers found Kant's philosophy inadequate, discusses their attempts to move beyond it, and the ways in which each of them found the alternatives of the others to be inadequate. Fincham believes that their successive failures motivated Schelling to return to the very Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalist metaphysics that Moses Mendelssohn had predicted would be destroyed by Kant's transcendental philosophy.

Sonia Sikka's "Johann Gottfried Herder" summarizes Herder's philosophy of language, aesthetics, epistemology and metaphysics, anthropology and philosophy of history, political philosophy, and philosophy of religion.

Daniel Dahlstrom's "Play and Irony: Schiller and Schlegel on the Liberating Power of Aesthetics" contrasts these two. Dahlstrom argues that Schiller's emphasis on play and transcending the Greeks' standards for poetry is motivated by anthropological considerations. He hopes for harmonizing, in play, between the competing demands of the sensual and the moral. In contrast, Schlegel's concern with irony is a result of thinking that poetry has historically and organically emerged from classical poetry, constituting an unfinished unity. He does not believe that sensual and moral needs can be harmonized, but instead advocates a continuing process of self-overcoming.

Robert Williams' "Fichte and Husserl: Life-world, the Other, and Philosophical Reflection" argues that, while Fichte's account of mutual recognition is superior to that of Husserl, it nevertheless privileges the I, such that the other remains a postulate, and so it is unable to achieve the we of mutual recognition. Although Fichte distinguishes natural consciousness from philosophical consciousness, where the latter observes and reflects upon the former, both occur at the level of the I.

Joseph Lawrence's "Schelling: Philosopher of Tragic Dissonance" discusses the early, middle, and late periods of Schelling's philosophizing. Lawrence argues that articulating the implications of a pantheistic and metaphysical materialism is a theme that connects Schelling's seemingly different systems. This chapter is especially important in showing that, while Hegel stands upon Schelling's shoulders -- and so, perhaps, sees farther -- Schelling's philosophy has a trajectory that extends beyond that of Hegel and is not merely a propaedeutic.

Bart Vandenabeele's "Schopenhauer on Empirical and Aesthetic Perception and Cognition" is a helpful survey of Schopenhauer's philosophy. It is especially useful in noting the points at which Schopenhauer provides no arguments for some of his most basic claims but rather takes them to be obvious, as well as for showing where his philosophy deviates from that of Kant. It is strange that this chapter precedes Terry Pinkard's on Hegel. Perhaps this is an oversight or it may be an attempt to interrupt the suggestion that Hegel's philosophy is the culmination of German idealism.

Pinkard's "G. W. F. Hegel" provides an overview of Hegel's early work with Schelling in Jena and a précis of the main sections in the Phenomenology of Spirit, the Science of Logic, the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences, and the Elements of the Philosophy of Right, as well as the later Hegel's lectures in Berlin on the philosophy of history, religion, and aesthetics. Pinkard concludes with a brief discussion of Hegel's legacy. As with Nenon's chapter on Kant, it is remarkable that such difficult and extensive material can be so clearly and concisely expressed.

Lawrence S. Stepelevich's "From Hegelian Reason to the Marxist Revolution, 1831-48" discusses the most important of the so-called Left-Hegelians or Young Hegelians: David Friedrich Strauss, Bruno Bauer, August von Ciezkowski, Moses Hess, Ludwig Feuerbach, Karl Marx, and Max Stirner. Stepelevich explains that these persons mainly began as religious, not political, radicals. His narrative shows that Marx's response, in the German Ideology, to Stirner's Ego and Its Own marks the transition from the Young Hegelians' readings of Hegel to scientific socialism.

Diane Morgan's "Saint-Simon, Fourier, and Proudhon: 'Utopian' French Socialism" claims that these figures have been overshadowed by the attention given to the scientific socialism of Marx and Engels, and urges that utopian socialism merits attention from philosophers. Unfortunately, this chapter does not make a compelling case that Saint-Simon, Fourier, and Proudhon actually merit such attention or have substantially influenced philosophers. It is strange to have such a chapter in an anthology titled Kant, Kantianism, and Idealism, moreover, unless "idealism" is understood in its colloquial sense.

Following each chapter, there is a list of that philosopher's major works in the original language and those available in English translation. The index at the end of the book lists relevant secondary articles and books, alphabetized by author's last name. It would have been helpful, however, if that secondary material had instead been grouped together by the philosopher discussed, so that readers would not need to hunt through the entire index to find, for example, those articles and books dealing with Schelling.

One useful feature of this anthology is that it employs footnotes rather than endnotes. It is especially helpful that the dates of birth and death, as well as a brief biography, of every person mentioned are provided in the footnotes. Alan Schrift, the series editor, has added footnotes, generally to indicate when a philosopher or concept is more fully discussed in another volume in the series. Following the chapters there is a 25-page chronology of major philosophical, cultural, and political events from 1618-2009.

The advantage of an anthology of this sort is that the chapters about the philosophers are written by experts. The disadvantage, of course, is that it cannot provide an overarching history of the figures. Such a history could have discussed, for example, how Hegel appropriates and alters Fichte's natural and philosophical consciousnesses. To somewhat compensate for this necessary failing, the authors contextualize the philosophers discussed, stating what persons and problems they were responding to as well as generally indicating their continuing reception.

The scope and content of continental philosophy is taken, for the most part, from professional associations, graduate programs, and journals, and especially the standard curriculum of courses covering it. The disadvantage of this is that continental philosophy is taken as given. The considerable advantage, however, is that students in such courses will find helpful resources in the anthologies in the series. As such, it can be highly recommended for upper-level undergraduates, graduate students, and others who are initially encountering the philosophers discussed.

Schrift and, presumably, the contributors to this series believe that the best way to characterize continental philosophy is through a historical presentation of its emergence. Taking continental philosophy as it is currently constituted, this series then seeks to discern how it develops from Kant onwards. What such an approach risks missing, however, is the extent to which this history is itself redactional, a retrospective positing of the presuppositions. As Michael Friedman demonstrates in A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger, the emergence of distinct traditions of analytic philosophy and continental philosophy is historically recent, less than a century old. Moreover, in Time in the Ditch: American Philosophy and the McCarthy Era, John McCumber shows how analytic philosophy subsequently moved even farther from continental philosophy as a result of the political pressures to which American philosophers were subjected. Looking to Kant and the German idealists for the origins of continental philosophy is as much creation and invention as it is discovery. And so it reifies the distinction and increases the distance between analytic and continental philosophy. "We cannot reproach a literature for grafting itself upon a prior violence (for that is always the case)," Michel de Certeau writes in Heterologies: Discourse on the Other, "but we can reproach it for not admitting it."