Kant on Beauty and Biology: An Interpretation of the Critique of Judgment

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Rachel Zuckert, Kant on Beauty and Biology: An Interpretation of the Critique of Judgment, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 409pp., $104.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521865890.

Reviewed by Fred Rauscher, Michigan State University


The slogan for commentators on Kant's Critique of Judgment has often been "divide and conquer." The third Critique has a superficial unity in that each of its parts discusses judgment, but it is easily divisible into Kant's two main parts on aesthetic and teleological judgment, with further subdivisions inside them and a distinct introduction on systematicity outside them. This kind of diversity exceeds that of Kant's other two Critiques. As a result most discussions of the third Critique focus on one or another of its parts. Most focus on Kant's theory of aesthetics. The second part on teleological judgment contains his discussion of biology on the one hand and his reflections on the purpose of the whole of the universe on the other hand, tempting those interested in Kant's theory of the sciences or Kant's theory of history and his practical philosophy to cut and paste those topics into separate treatments. Even beyond these divisions lies the topic Kant raises only in his Introduction: the role of judgment in providing systematicity to empirical knowledge. All this is presented in a book that Rachel Zuckert rightly calls "a work of tortuousness of expression extreme even for a Kantian text" (4).

Zuckert is among the few who offer a unified interpretation of the whole of the third Critique. (At least, most of it. She admits that her interpretation leaves out the discussion of the sublime and of the relation of teleological judgment to morality.) In this light, the title of her book is misleading. The terms "beauty" and "biology" suggest that the book's claims are limited to those areas and that the book is a collection of distinct discussions of those two topics. In fact, the broad claims of the book relate to epistemology and its relation to purposiveness in general; these claims are then applied to beauty and biology as part of a systematic overview of the role of purposiveness and judgment in human experience. After an overview of the book, then, this review will focus on a few claims about epistemology and purposiveness in general.

Kant on Beauty and Biology is a bold and remarkable book. Zuckert takes a sweeping approach to Kant's thought while still engaging in detailed textual exegesis and debate with the secondary literature. Hardly a page goes by without reference to part of the literature (at least the English language part of it) on the various topics touched upon by her analysis. She deftly moves from issue to issue, anticipating and answering objections, to defend what to some will seem at first to be implausible claims. I am not entirely convinced of all the details, but I completed the book with a revised view of Kant's Critique of Judgment and its place in Kant's system.

The Introduction and first two chapters serve as a basis for the main claims of the book regarding epistemology. Zuckert maintains that the principle of "purposiveness without purpose", used specifically by Kant with regard to the third moment of the definition of the beautiful with regard to relations, can be applied in general to all uses of reflective judgment. Reflective judgment is the attempt to find a universal, not itself given, under which various given particulars can be subsumed (the reverse relationship constitutes determinative judgment). Zuckert stresses the way in which reflective judgment generates a unity among the diverse, contingent, given particulars in a way that requires that a whole be apprehended as a set of means-ends relations that can be understood only in a "future-directed" manner that is itself incompatible with an objective time order. Chapter 1 explains the nature of unity amid diversity. Diversity, or manifoldness, in nature is of course of importance to Kant and central to the discursive nature of human cognition which requires concepts to unite the particulars. Zuckert sees a gap in Kant's account in the Critique of Pure Reason regarding the formation of empirical concepts as themselves unities among a diversity, in addition to the more general justification of the affinity of nature for our application of systematicity to its particulars. Chapter 2 provides more detail about the scope of "purposiveness without a purpose". Rather than being restricted to the narrow application to beauty mentioned above, it is intended to cover virtually any application of purposiveness. In essence, while Kant uses the phrase "without a purpose" to mean that we humans cannot even imagine a purpose, Zuckert uses it to mean that there is no objective purpose independent of human thought, even if humans can imagine one. For example, while Kant would explain our comprehension of an organ in terms of the purpose we attribute to it with regard to the rest of the organism, Zuckert would note that our reference to this purpose is only subjective and hence that the subject of our claim is really "without a purpose." More about this issue below.

Chapters 3-4 move to a specific discussion of the analysis of purposes in the Critique of Teleological Judgment. Chapter 3 looks at the transformations in Kant's explanation of a unity in nature from the first to the third Critique. The Appendix to the Dialectic in the Critique of Pure Reason had already invoked non-constitutive principles for unifying diverse empirical concepts and laws as well as used the idea of God to ground the claim that nature can be unified in terms of purposes. Zuckert contends that these attempts at unification are insufficient because they stress a mechanistic approach and apply only to the ordering of laws themselves and not to particulars in nature. Particular organisms need to have the reciprocal relations among the parts characterized causally -- a matter left out of the first Critique account. Chapter 4 argues that teleological relations cannot be constitutive of nature because they cannot be schematized. To say that purposes cannot be schematized is to say that they cannot be explained in terms of distinct events that can be placed in a time-relation of before (cause) and after (effect). They can have a "future-directed" temporality related to realization of the purpose or continuation of the organism. This claim is vital and will receive more attention below.

In chapters 5-9, Zuckert turns to the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment to apply this conception of purposiveness without a purpose back, as it were, to the area in which Kant originally used the term, but with more extensive application than Kant himself identified in print. Chapter 5 covers the application of purposiveness without a purpose to the object of aesthetic experience, that is, the particular independent object that a subject deems beautiful. This is Kant's explicit application of purposiveness without a purpose. Chapter 6 then looks at the mental state of the subject as itself an example of purposiveness without a purpose. Here Zuckert sees the uniquely aesthetic pleasure as characterized by a future-directedness, the maintenance of that pleasure itself, rather than past-directed to a concept or a pain (as are feelings of the good and the agreeable). Chapter 7 examines the activity of the subject in aesthetic response, the free play of the faculties of imagination and understanding, to interpret it in light of purposiveness without a purpose. The free harmony of these faculties is contingent, "lawfulness without law" as Kant puts it (5:241), which attempts to synthesize diverse sensible properties of objects, and hence employs a purposive activity itself. Chapter 8 provides an interpretation of Kant's deduction of aesthetic judgments that invokes purposiveness without a purpose as an a priori principle constitutive of the very possibility of aesthetic experience. Finally a Conclusion contends that the conception of human life as itself evocative of purposiveness without a purpose can help to reconcile human beings to their place in the universe through culture and community that reflects aesthetic judgment as a medium between natural contingency (theoretical claims) and moral necessity (practical claims). This conclusion also very quickly suggests that the subjective temporality at work in purposive activity might justify abandonment of Kant's insistence on objective temporal order as a condition for subjective experience in the Refutation of Idealism.

There are many topics that deserve more attention than I can give here. I will focus just on three.

First, in order for this interpretation to work, in each case there has to be a purposiveness without a purpose. For aesthetics this criterion is easily met, since it is in the discussion of aesthetic judgment that Kant introduces and utilizes the concept of purposiveness without a purpose. But for teleological judgment this criterion appears at first glance to be impossible to meet. In our judgments about organisms we do identify the purpose of various organs in their means-to-ends relations to other organs within the same organism. Zuckert defends her claim in light of this kind of objection by clarifying that "without a purpose" means not that no purpose can be imagined but that any alleged purpose cannot be attributed to nature itself, so that "any purposiveness of nature is purposiveness without a purpose, for non-human nature does not act in accord with conceptual intentions" (80). I see two difficulties with this extension of the scope of purposiveness without a purpose. First, it begs the question about whether there are real purposes in nature. Kant's argument in the Critique of Teleological Judgment indicates that he believes human beings do consider purposes when viewing organisms and nature in general, and his question then becomes whether nature itself can be understood to be in part governed by such purposes. It remains possible that nature is so governed, although human beings cannot make that affirmative claim. Second, the claim seems inapplicable to an area of the third Critique Zuckert does not cover in detail, the argument about the "final purpose" of the universe. Human beings are there constrained to view the universe in light of some possible self-standing purpose (an end that is not a means for any further end). The human capacity for morality is deemed to be this final purpose. In this case Kant clearly identifies a purpose that can be posited as an inescapable element of human moral experience from the practical point of view. Surely this perspective cannot rank as "purposiveness without a purpose" except on the most reductive naturalist approaches that deny any standing to subjective, lived experience. Perhaps this issue would have been clarified had Zuckert given criteria that specified some possible "purposiveness with a purpose" that would indicate what she might have had in mind by the phrase "without a purpose" short of being equivalent to "without affirmed objective reality."

Second, Zuckert argues that teleological causal claims are incompatible with an objective time order. The relation between causality and time is complex in her analysis. While mechanical causal relations can be schematized in an objective temporal order, teleological relations cannot. She usually illustrates this claim with regard to the interrelationship of organs in an organism, but applies it to other instances of purposiveness as well, such as the feeling of aesthetic pleasure. Here the means and ends operate continually with no temporal reference at all (distinguishing them from the relations of coexistence in the Third Analogy, which can at least be conceived to operate temporally). If her claim is that the lack of an objective temporal ordering of the causal relations means that these causal relations cannot be part of an objective nature, then she is overlooking that these causal relations might just best be understood independently of any temporal ordering yet instantiated within the objective temporal order. By analogy, mathematical relationships can be understood reciprocally (7+5=12, and likewise 12-7=5) and have no necessary temporal order yet can be instantiated in actual relationships among objects in nature. If I am correct in this reasoning, then teleological causes can be part of nature although not themselves mechanical causes, and even though teleological causes cannot be the basis of our knowledge of nature. Further reasons must be given (and are given by both Zuckert and Kant).

Third, a word about methodology. Zuckert notes that her work is "reconstructive" rather than simply exegetical (17). She quite openly attributes positions to Kant that have no direct basis in the text (most notably the extension of "purposiveness without a purpose" to the whole of reflective judgment). I am in complete agreement with the utility of this kind of enterprise. What is important is not necessarily precisely what Kant said but what Kant meant. To determine what Kant meant involves stepping outside the particular details of the text (while respecting particular arguments) to find connections and tendencies in the whole, and then assessing the results for their philosophical plausibility. In contemporary philosophical practice, such a relation to other philosophers' work is the norm, two examples being questions and comments at a live paper presentation and book reviews such as the one you are currently (presumably, since you read this far) enjoying. The standard for such commentary is not a strict adherence to the text but a fair philosophical reconstruction that could gain approval of the original writer. One hopes that the writer would say "yes, that is what I meant." History of philosophy differs from contemporary philosophy in that the original writer is no longer able to confirm or deny such reconstruction. A strictly exegetical historian of philosophy at this point takes the path of denying that there can be any remaining standard for judging such reconstruction. A reconstructive historian of philosophy, in contrast, shifts the standard for judging the reconstruction from the original writer to the collective contemporary readership. We do not have Kant with us to say "that is what I meant", but we do have each other to say "that must be what Kant meant." In Zuckert's case, I hope she would say of this review that it captures what she meant, and I can say of her book that it is a strong case for what Kant meant.