Kant on Practical Life: From Duty to History

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Kristi E. Sweet, Kant on Practical Life: From Duty to History, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 223pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107037236.

Reviewed by Sasha Mudd, University of Southampton


In her strikingly ambitious book, Kristi Sweet offers a synoptic overview of Kant's practical thought, arguing that it constitutes an organic unity, despite Kant's own failure to exhibit it as such. Few attempts of this kind have been made to articulate the unity and meaning of Kant's practical philosophy as a whole, and for good reason. Kant's diverse and far-ranging discussions of duty, the moral law and virtue, on the one hand, and the state, religion and culture, on the other -- to name just a few -- evince no obvious overall coherence. Indeed, Kant's practical thought contains deontological and teleological elements that many have found difficult to reconcile. This lack of a clear sense of "how it all hangs together" is the lacuna Sweet aims to address (7). She does so by offering a novel account of practical reason's essential nature, and by interpreting the various elements of practical life Kant examines as distinct, mutually conditioning expressions of this nature.

Sweet's point of departure is reason's demand for the unconditioned. This demand is seldom explicitly discussed in Kant's practical works, and is best known as the supreme principle of theoretical reason, as Kant presents that faculty in the first Critique. Sweet boldly argues that this demand ought to be understood as the supreme principal of practical reason as well. So construed, she argues, the demand requires that human freedom become the unconditioned cause of the world. Accordingly, she writes "Kant thinks freedom . . . as a causality through practical reason, as that which can bring forth the absolute totality of appearances. . . . Human willing, human action, human reason have the task of being the origin of what is" (35). On Sweet's interpretation, this task "animates, authors, governs, and organizes the various aspects" of Kant's practical thought, and Sweet devotes the book to showing how this is so (8). Tracing the dialectical development of practical reason in its quest to condition the 'whole', she proceeds from duty and the good will to virtue and the highest good, and from there to civil society, the state, culture and history. Sweet's sweeping contention is that no aspect of Kant's practical philosophy fails to express this fundamental, dialectical development.

What is gained by interpreting Kant's practical philosophy in this way? Sweet claims that her reading reveals the profoundly communal nature of Kant's practical thought, allowing us to see how many elements typically regarded as peripheral -- for instance Kant's discussions of religion, history and culture -- are in fact of central, systematic importance. This is because, on her reading, reason's demand not only requires the development of personal virtue but, as is less often appreciated, the collective pursuit of a common moral world. Indeed, Sweet goes so far as to suggest that practical reason demands that we participate in a kind of collective rational agency, for only through this agency, she contends, can reason produce the whole of 'what is'.

For reason to become the unconditioned causality of the whole of what is -- the world -- we must will the good in concert with one another. Our immediate relatedness to others means that it becomes the exercise of reason itself -- and not my mere will alone -- that causes the moral world embodied in the ethical community. This is how reason's demand for a totality as an unconditioned whole is ultimately met (175).

A second theme Sweet's analysis brings to the fore is the intractable finitude that, she alleges, lies at the center of reason's dialectical development. Reason's quest to condition the whole unfolds, she argues, in and through our given finite nature. In tracing the contours of this unfolding, Sweet credits Kant with thematizing our finitude in important ways that are seldom sufficiently appreciated. While her analysis offers many further insights into Kant's account of practical life, these two elements are by far the most distinctive features of the unity she seeks to articulate.

I admire the ambition of this book and believe Sweet does well to draw our attention to the common features that characterize reason in both its practical and theoretical employments. Moreover, I think she is right that Kant's practical philosophy is more unified than many suppose, and that neglecting or underestimating this unity harms our understanding of Kant in important ways. I do not, however, find the particular case she builds for this unity convincing for two reasons. First, her interpretation of practical reason's fundamental demand strikes me as philosophically unclear and in need of better exegetical defense. Second, the unity she claims to find in Kant's practical thought is undermined by the contradictions she attributes to him, contradictions that are especially glaring in her treatment of Kant's views on finitude.

The chief difficulty underlying both these problems, in my view, is the book's highly ambitious scope. In glossing Kant's view on a vast number of topics, Sweet leaves insufficient room to argue fully for her novel interpretation of practical reason. Moreover, in covering an enormous amount of textual ground, she forecloses the possibility of evaluating the philosophical merits, and indeed the coherence, of the views she attributes to Kant in any significant depth. Both of these problems could be ameliorated by a more penetrating engagement with the issues under discussion. What the book lacks in depth, however, it makes up for in breadth. Sweet offers many provocative suggestions and insights that will encourage readers to look at Kant's practical philosophy as a whole through fresh eyes. This is no small accomplishment, even if it is not all the author set out to achieve.

In what follows, I examine in further detail the two difficulties outlined above. Sweet's novel interpretation of practical reason hinges on Kant's discussion of theoretical reason in the first critique. There he claims that reason's chief demand is for the unconditioned systematic totality of our cognition. Sweet contends that this demand finds satisfaction only and ultimately in the cosmological idea of freedom, construed as the uncaused cause (or unconditioned condition) of the world whole. She goes on, controversially, to identify this cosmological idea with the causal efficacy of pure practical reason itself. Accordingly she writes that "The good will . . . stands as the unconditioned causality that must give rise to the whole of the conditioned" (48). What is the upshot of this for practical purposes? Practical reason, in demanding that we realize a good will, tasks each of us with "creating the whole of what is through [our] actions' (142).

That reason's demand for the unconditioned has fundamental practical significance is not particularly controversial, but Sweet's interpretation of this significance is. Given that the whole of her project is staked on this interpretation, the arguments she offers in support of it -- in the space of a mere four pages -- are too quick and thin. In particular, she would do well to explore objections to her reading and to rule-out nearby interpretive possibilities, many of which have stronger prima facie plausibility. For instance, reason's demand for the unconditioned, practically construed, is more naturally read as a demand for the creation of a moral world (as distinct from the natural one). On this reading, reason does not seek to become the source of 'all that is' but rather to unify and systematize its own operations. That is, reason seeks to make a totality -- a metaphorical 'world' -- if you will, of its own activity. Indeed, so well grounded is this interpretation in Kant's texts and so ubiquitous in the literature, that Sweet herself occasionally seems to endorse it. In a variety of places she describes reason as demanding the creation of a (moral) world, thereby appearing to retreat from her much stronger claim that reason in fact demands to become the source of 'all that is'. I find little evidence that Kant understood reason's practical task to be that of world creation in the literal sense Sweet seems to intend.

Assuming, however, that Sweet is indeed committed to this very strong claim, one is left puzzled by what it could possibly mean, and her discussion does surprisingly little to illuminate this. She writes:

For reason to become the unconditioned causality of the whole of what is -- the world -- we must will the good in concert with one another. Our immediate relatedness to others means that it becomes the exercise of reason itself -- and not my mere will alone -- that causes the moral world embodied in the ethical community. This is how reason's demand for a totality as an unconditioned whole is ultimately met. (175)

Despite Sweet's evident retreat from her strong claim in this very passage (she again reverts to the notion of 'a world'), it appears that some notion of collective agency is instrumental to her understanding of reason's task. Such an ambitious notion of agency, however, about which Sweet says little, would require much further development in order to gain intelligibility. This is one example of the sorts of philosophical questions her radical interpretation raises but does not answer.

There is a final difficulty worth mentioning concerning Sweet's central interpretive gambit. She argues that we are warranted in taking reason's demand for the unconditioned, typically associated with its theoretical use, as fundamentally practical in character because in the first critique Kant is very clear that it is only in its practical use that reason is ultimately satisfied. As Sweet writes:

Whereas speculative reason is famously relegated to its peculiar fate -- its perpetual dissatisfaction in its quest for the unconditioned -- practical reason is where reason can find its satisfaction. . . . it is as freedom that reason becomes what it demands (34)

Sweet argument here is, however, disappointingly thin, especially in light of Kant's later equivocation (or, indeed, reversal) on this issue. As she herself concedes, "For Kant, it turns out that in practical life human beings meet a peculiar fate similar to that found in speculative life. Namely, the task that reason sets for itself is not fully attainable" (101). If Sweet is correct that in the end reason's demand is neither fully satisfied theoretically nor practically, as I think she is, then her grounds for construing this demand as fundamentally practical in the first place need reconsidering.

About the second difficulty I mentioned earlier, I will be more brief. Sweet's claim that Kant's practical thought constitutes a coherent whole is undermined by the contradictory views she attributes to him, especially regarding the relation of reason to nature and therewith human finitude. This lack of coherence is most clearly seen in chapter six, where Sweet discusses Kant on culture and history. There she begins by acknowledging that although the fulfillment of reason's practical demands is "perpetually deferred", we must nevertheless think this fulfillment possible in order rationally to pursue it (184). And in order to do this, she argues, Kant holds that "we must . . . rethink what nature itself is" (184). This task of rethinking nature itself (as rationally purposive) gets discharged differently with respect to culture and history, as Sweet shows in some detail. Unfortunately, however, her interpretation of this re-thinking remains unclear. As a result the unwitting impression she gives of Kant's thought on these issues is fractured, not unified.

In her discussion Sweet appears to attribute to Kant both the view that we must think of culture as 'undoing' nature's influence on us, and the view that this is actually what culture does. A similar problem crops up in her discussion of Kant on history, where she asserts both that the ostensibly immoral effects of our inclinations in fact serve reason's ends, and that these effects must merely be seen to do so. It is of course possible that these slips merely reflect infelicitous expression, and that Sweet's settled view on the matter is epistemological rather than ontological, as indicated by her discussion at the beginning of the chapter. But this scarcely helps matters. she writes, "in culture we judge nature as undoing its own influence over us, while history is judged as the domain in which our inclinations actually have a positive accord with reason's end" (185). How the contradiction between these two judgments should be understood or resolved is never addressed. Nor does Sweet address the larger question of how we make these sorts of judgments in the first place given that we 'know' nature to be indifferent to rational human purposes, and given that culture (if not also, in some measure, history) is a function of human freedom, not an expression of some supernatural agency.

Sweet, at least occasionally, seems to acknowledge these sorts of problems, as when she writes, "the satisfaction of reason, while necessarily thought by us as possible, is at the same time thought by us as either perpetually deferred, or ultimately outside of our own control" (103). But how does Kant think agents 'think' both these contradictory things? What does it even mean to 'think' contradictory claims in this manner? Sweet gives no answer to these questions and even appears not to notice them. Indeed, rather than addressing these difficulties, her account merely raises them again in ontological form. She writes, "The attainment of the moral world will be found only in history. The work of reason -- both in the establishment of a rational political community and a purely rational religion -- is an unending task" (183). But again Sweet leaves it unclear how she thinks Kant can have it both ways. Either the work of reason is unending, in which case the moral world will not be found in history, or the work of reason is not unending, in which case the moral world will be historically realized. The fact that we merely have to think these things, if that is indeed Sweet's view, does nothing to resolve the patent incoherence of these positions. The problem, of course, is not so much that there are difficulties -- or even outright contradictions -- in Kant's own treatment of these themes, but that these problems, much belabored in the literature, appear to be swept under the carpet by Sweet. Indeed, she marshals Kant's views on culture and history precisely to show the overall coherence of his practical thought, when a majority have thought they demonstrate just the opposite. Her failure to engage with the dominant competing interpretation here undermines the case for unity she seeks to make.

In all fairness to her, Sweet herself concedes that Kant's characterization of reason's relationship to nature, and therewith our "intractable finitude", is "complex" and "deeply ambivalent". She writes, "On the one hand, Kant's practical philosophy preserves our finitude, and on the other it perpetually encourages us to think its dissolution" (208). But this concession sits uneasily with the larger claims about Kant's practical thought she is interested in defending. And this issue takes us back to the earlier problem I raised about Sweet's interpretation of practical reason. If practical reason is tasked with creating a systematic rational whole out of its own activities -- if this is the metaphorical 'world' it is called to create -- then reason would seem to enjoy an important degree of independence from nature. But if, on the other hand, practical reason is called to become the source of 'all that is' -- as Sweet contends -- this has a radically different set of consequences. Her apparent inability to decide between the more usual interpretation of practical reason and her own radical view muddies her take on the relationship of reason to nature in Kant's thought. This is a pity, since it is one of the book's principal themes.

Despite the centrality of the difficulties I have raised, it would be badly misleading to suggest that Sweet's book is damned by them. On the contrary, the boldness of her vision and the dazzling scope of her discussion make this a very engaging and provocative read for anyone interested in Kant. All by themselves these merits make the book worth reading.