Kant on Self-Knowledge and Self-Formation: The Nature of Inner Experience

Kraus Kant

Katharina T. Kraus, Kant on Self-Knowledge and Self-Formation: The Nature of Inner Experience, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 306pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781108812757.

Reviewed by Pirachula Chulanon, Toronto Metropolitan University 


Kant’s account of the self is no doubt the most fascinating but also the most difficult facet of his philosophical thinking. It is complex, multi-layered, and inextricably bound with many central tenets of his system. It is no surprise, then, that interpreters rarely attempt to reconstruct the whole picture but more often focus on a single aspect of it. What is lacking in localized approaches, however, is the sense of how different pieces of the puzzle fit together. Katharina Kraus’s ambitious new book remedies this by offering a much-needed comprehensive treatment of Kant’s view on the self that straddles the a priori-empirical as well as the theoretical-practical divide.[1] The book skillfully maps out crucial interpretive issues that frame different parts of Kant’s picture and the various stances one could take toward them, while introducing fresh alternatives to the discussion. Its thorough engagement with both Kant’s writings and existing scholarship is exemplary. This book deserves to become a standard reference point for any discussion of Kant’s view on the self.

The tenor running through the six chapters of the book is the idea that the possibility of self-cognition (and its object, the psychological person) depends on the cooperation of the sensibility, the understanding, and reason. Part I (Chapters 1–2) presents an account of inner sense as the general faculty of inner receptivity and develops an “interactive” model of perception, which helps to explain how self-affection can be consistently construed as having a dual function: enabling temporal consciousness of objects in general as well as empirical intuition of one’s inner states. Part II (Chapters 3–4) turns to apperception as the faculty that underpins the general form of reflexivity common to all conscious objective representations and clarifies how the ‘I think’, being an expression of this form of reflexivity, prefigures reflective self-consciousness. Part III (Chapters 5–7) completes Kraus’s original account of inner experience by demonstrating how the regulative use of the idea of the soul fills in the gap between self-reference in thought and the subjectless deliverance of inner sense. The final two chapters explore the implications of this account of inner experience for Kant’s account of the normative structure of the theoretical activity of self-knowledge and the practical activity of self-formation. It would be impossible to engage in detail with all aspects of this rich and sweeping book within the space of this review. The comments that follow will focus on Kraus’s account of inner experience and the role of the idea of the soul, which constitutes the core of the book and which I consider to be its most original and insightful contribution.

We make empirical judgments by which we ascribe mental states located in time (like occurrent thoughts, desires, and so on) to ourselves and, hence, to a self that is identical through time and across different mental states. Kant seems nowhere to deny the possibility of empirical judgments about oneself. On the contrary, it is plausible to identify these judgments, as Kraus does, with the conceptual content of what he calls inner experience (130). However, Kant also indicates that there is an important disparity between inner and outer experience: unlike outer intuition, inner intuition does not present us with any persistent object, and so it fails to meet the condition for applying the category of substance (and, consequently, the other relational categories). Kraus’s account of inner experience seeks to address the problem of how, despite the disparity, inner experience is possible as empirical cognition of the thinker-qua-object or the psychological person. In Kraus’s view, inner sense by itself does not yield an object-directed representation of a self that is identical across different representations and through time (Chapter 2). Neither can this self-representation be derived from transcendental apperception, since this constitutes only the “general form of reflexivity” that pertains to any conscious representations of objects (Chapter 3). Thus, the problem is how we get from inner intuition and the awareness of reflexivity of our representations to referential or reflective self-consciousness.

The first part of Kraus’s solution (Chapter 4) explicates the relationship between the logical I (the subject of apperception) and the psychological I (the object of inner experience). As Kraus rightly insists, there must be a sense in which the two I-representations are “identical regarding their referent” (152). She fleshes out this identity claim as the claim that a successful referential use of ‘I’ must ascribe representations that are unified through their belonging to one and the same consciousness (expressed by the ‘I think’, 108–9) to one and the same real subject. Thus, the question is how ‘I’, which originally is a mere expression of the form of reflexivity of my representations, comes to refer to me as a real psychological entity. Kraus proposes that the answer is given in the Paralogisms. The positive contribution of the Paralogisms is the specification of the “logical predicates” of ‘I’, from which the “semantic rules” that fix its referent in experience can be derived. For instance, the minor premise of the second paralogism states that I must think of myself as “an absolute (though merely logical) unity” (A350). This entails, according to Kraus, the following semantic rule: “The mental equivalent of ‘I’ refers to a single referent who cannot be divided into self-standing parts” (149). Kraus’s fundamental point, as I understand it, is that the ‘I think’ specifies a priori the determinations of oneself as an object of thought prior to that object being given intuition and in accordance with the condition of sensibility. In other words, the reflexive structure of my representations dictates how I must think of myself as an object of possible cognition: “If these logical predicates define conditions of how one must think of oneself, then they also define conditions of how one must cognize oneself, since cognition presupposes thought” (148). In this way, we can explain how ‘I’ can refer to myself as an object of inner experience (if it turns out that there is such an object).

This is a bold and intriguing thesis. However, it is unclear how the mere “logical exposition” of the ‘I think’ can yield rules that fix the referent of ‘I’ when employed in empirical contexts (unless, perhaps, it is supplemented with a metaphysical account of representational activity which maps logical features of representations to real features of the representing subject). How can an a priori representation that expresses the “mere form of consciousness” entail what the subject of that consciousness is like? If the ‘I think’ is merely formal and empty (cf. A346/B404), how can the determinations of the thinker-qua-object “follow analytically” from it? Indeed, Kraus emphasizes that these determinations are “logical” and not “real determinations of a real thinking agent” (146). However, what she means is that these determinations are specified in terms of pure rather than schematized categories (143). The categories (schematized or not) are the concept of an object in general; as such, they represent basic ontological properties of an object and thus are to be distinguished from the logical functions. Therefore, despite its label, what Kraus calls the “logical” determinations of the I, must be understood as already possessing minimal ontological significance.[2] This can be illustrated by the example cited above: the property of “not [being divisible] into self-standing parts” clearly is a real property that can be instantiated by an object as opposed to a logical property of a thought of an object. To reiterate the problem, the ‘I think’ (by Kraus’s own light) does not seem to have the right sort of content from which the categorial determinations of the thinker can be derived.

The not-quite-logical status of the logical I and its predicates in Kraus’s view tends to become obscured in her discussion. But note that it is implied by her rejection of a common view which construes the logical I as a merely logical subject or a thought-entity, on the ground that it cannot be just “an object of mere thought without existence above and beyond thought” (145–6). It is also consistent with her characterization of the logical predicates of ‘I’ as the “categories of self-reference”, analogous to the “categories of object-reference” (150), which suggests that we should think of these predicates as the basic concepts through which we represent ourselves as an object.

However, Kraus cannot mean that there are two completely distinct sets of “categories”, one through which we think outer objects and the other through which we think the self-qua-object, for the categories are the concept of an object in general, without regard to the distinction between inner and outer sensibility. Rather, it seems to me that Kraus’s categories of self-reference are akin to the determinations of the concept of matter in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. In each case, the categorial determinations in question are, respectively, those specific to the object of inner experience in general and to the object of outer experience in general.

If my diagnosis is correct, Kraus effectively claims that there is a significant difference in the ways the highest genus concept of the object of inner experience and that of the object of outer experience are given their specific categorial determinations. In the case of outer experience, these determinations are specified from bottom up: on the basis of the concept of matter first acquired from outer experience (by “carrying [this concept] through” [durchführen] all four functions of the categories; 4:476). In contrast, in the case of inner experience, Kraus seems to suggest, they are specified from top down: a priori and independent of inner experience itself. Although this is an interesting suggestion, it is puzzling why we need to assume yet another disparity between inner and outer experience at this level. Kraus’s proposal might perhaps gain plausibility as an explanation of the referential use of ‘I’ if the possibility of inner experience as empirical self-cognition were ultimately ruled out by the more basic disparity. However, Kraus’s view (as we will see below) is that this problem can be solved and the possibility of empirical self-cognition vindicated. If this is so, the completely a priori categorial determinations of the thinker-qua-object appear gratuitous. Why, then, can these determinations not be derived in the same (bottom-up) way as in the case of outer experience following the (“analogical”) application of the relational categories to inner intuition? In fact, Kant seems to indicate that in this regard there is a parity between inner and outer experience, as he identifies the highest genus concept that would underlie the special metaphysics of inner nature (the counterpart of the concept of matter) as the empirical concept of a thinking being (4:470).[3]

Kraus’s highly original reading of the Paralogisms constitutes the first part of her solution to the problem of the possibility of inner experience. As she helpfully notes, the a priori conditions of self-reference “spell out how the term ‘I’ can be used to refer to a thinker only on the condition that something real can instantiate the term” (149). Thus, the possibility of self-reference and, hence, of inner experience is contingent upon there being some sensibly given object that instantiates the “logical predicates” of ‘I’. Whether there is such an object depends on the possibility of empirical consciousness of the numerical identity of oneself through time (161–67), and this in turn depends on the applicability of the category of substance to inner intuition. The second part of Kraus’s solution (Chapter 5) aims to explain how this is possible despite the basic disparity between inner and outer intuition.

Kraus’s solution to the disparity problem is the culmination of her previously published work (Kraus 2018 and 2019). It brings her account of the conditions under which I can “conceive of myself as a psychological person who is embedded in the spatio-temporal and causally efficient structure of the world” (171) to completion. At the center of her account is a reinterpretation of the regulative role of the transcendental idea of the soul. In a nutshell, Kraus argues that the idea of the soul supplies the “presentation of a mental whole”, which substitutes for a persistent object in inner intuition and thereby enables the temporal determination of inner appearances according to the category of substance and other relational categories. In other words, the absence of the schema of persistence in inner intuition amounts to the lack of an empirical concept of mind; the idea of the soul substitutes precisely for this missing concept, making possible the conceptualization of inner appearances as objects of empirical cognition (207). In this way, the idea of the soul provides a “context of intelligibility”, within which a certain kind of cognition (empirical self-cognition) becomes intelligible in the first place. Kraus helpfully compares the intelligibility-enabling role of the idea of the soul with that of the idea of purposiveness, without which we would not be able to cognize a certain chunk of matter as an organism (173).

This is an innovative solution to a familiar problem. However, it is inadequately supported by textual evidence. To my knowledge, Kant never makes the slightest indication that the idea of the soul plays the role of a substitute-schema of categories. He does say that the idea of reason is an “analogue of a schema of sensibility” (A665/B693), a remark which Kraus heavily relies upon to defend her reading. Nonetheless, the very same passage makes it clear that the ideas are analogous to the sensible schemata in this sense: the ideas mediate between the manifold of empirical concepts and the idea of systematic unity, just as the schemata mediate between the manifold of empirical intuitions and the categories. What Kant does not say (here or elsewhere) is that the ideas of reason mediate between the second pair of representations. Moreover, to insist that they do would contradict Kant’s claim that “the understanding constitutes an object for reason, just as sensibility does for the understanding” (A664/B692) and that “pure reason leaves to the understanding everything that relates directly to objects of intuition [. . . .] It reserves for itself only the absolute totality in the use of concepts” (A326–27/B383).

Further, it is difficult to grasp how the idea of the soul, given the kind of representation it is and its representational content, can possibly fulfill the role Kraus attributes to it. The transcendental ideas, according to Kant, just are the categories themselves insofar as they are “[freed] from the unavoidable limitations of a possible experience” (A409/B435; cf. A320/B377). If the problem we seek to solve is how certain categories can be applied to inner intuitions, it is unclear how bringing in another concept which is itself derived from the categories will solve the problem (the idea of the soul, too, must be applied to inner intuitions, inasmuch as we must, according to Kraus, conceptualize these intuitions as representing “parts of the mental whole”). In addition, what it means for the ideas to consist in the categories transposed beyond the limits of experience is that we derive the ideas by taking the “synthetic unity” of experience and extending it “all the way to the absolutely unconditioned” (A326/B383). Being concepts of absolute synthesis, the ideas “consider all experiential cognition as determined through an absolute totality of conditions” (A327/B384, emphasis added). If each transcendental idea, for Kant, presupposes experience of a certain sort (e.g., inner experience) whose unity it represents as unconditioned, then it cannot itself be a condition for the possibility of experience of that sort.

Regarding its content, the idea of the soul is a concept of a noumenal entity (a simple thinking substance). This raises a question about its relevance for empirical cognition of the self as an appearance. How can a concept of a noumenal soul substitute for an empirical concept of a phenomenal thinking being that we lack? Kraus provides some arguments against the view she calls the “noumenal” interpretation, which takes the idea of the soul to “refer” to the noumenal ground of inner appearances (188). However, the target of these arguments is the view which affirms an objectively valid application of the idea of soul to a thing-in-itself and, thus, its legitimate constitutive use (189). Kraus’s rejection of this view does not eliminate the fact that the idea of the soul remains a concept of a noumenal entity (this just is what it is an idea of) even when used regulatively. But if the issue is how we come to represent a phenomenal substance (or an “analogue” of it) in inner experience, it is not obvious how conceiving of ourselves (analogically or otherwise) in accordance with the idea of the noumenal soul will put us in a better position to do this. Perhaps Kraus has a way to address this and the other worries I have brought up in this review. I hope that she will return to some of these issues in her future works.

Kraus’s inventive approaches to perennial problems in Kant interpretation are as thought-provoking as they are bold. One of the virtues of this book lies in the range, depth, and originality of the questions it provokes. In raising and helping us formulate these questions, it opens up new avenues for our thinking—about Kant’s philosophy as a whole and about the nature of the self. No one who is interested in these important subjects can afford to ignore this book.


Klemme, Heiner. Kants Philosophie des Subjekts. Hamburg: Meiner, 1996.

Kraus, Katharina. “The Soul as the ‘Guiding Idea’ of Psychology: Kant on Scientific Psychology, Systematicity, and the Idea of the Soul.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A 71 (2018): 77–88.

Kraus, Katharina. “The Parity and Disparity Between Inner and Outer Experience in Kant.” Kantian Review 24, no. 2 (2019): 171–95.

Longuenesse, Béatrice. I, Me, Mine: Back to Kant, and Back Again. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017.


[1] Notable examples of previous attempts are Klemme (1996) and Longuenesse (2017).

[2] This implication is also difficult to square with Kraus’s claim that these determinations arise from the logical use of the understanding (133).

[3] Note that this piece of textual evidence also speaks against Kraus’s view that the idea of the soul functions as the highest genus concept of psychology (235ff.).