Kant's Aesthetic Epistemology: Form and World

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Fiona Hughes, Kant's Aesthetic Epistemology: Form and World, Edinburgh UP, 2007, 324pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748621224.

Reviewed by Arata Hamawaki, Auburn University



Kant, as is well-known, held that the pure concepts of the understanding, or the categories, are conditions of the possibility of the “experience” of objects. By this, he appears to have meant not just that the categories are conditions of the possibility of thought, or judgment, regarding objects, but also of the possibility of the sensory experience, or perception, of objects. This impression is, perhaps, strongest in the climactic section 26 of the second-edition Transcendental Deduction, in which Kant seems intent to close off the possibility that, despite the fact that all thought must conform to the categories, there may nonetheless be “rogue” intuitions or appearances that fail to so conform. So he seems to argue that the categories are conditions even of the sensory apprehension of objects. However, success in closing such a potential gap between mind and world can strike one as a pyrrhic victory. This is how I think Fiona Hughes, in her book Kant’s Aesthetic Epistemology, sees it. She does so because it promotes a picture of the mind’s relation to the world she calls “impositionalist”: the view that anything that can come to us through our sensibility is necessarily stamped from the outset with the “imprint” of the forms of the understanding. As Hughes argues, if it is guaranteed in advance of any actual experience that anything that we experience must conform to the categories, then it is hard to credit what we receive from experience as knowledge of an “extra-mental world”. Even if the objects of our knowledge have an existence that is independent of us, it will seem, she thinks, that what we know of the object would be nothing more than the “imposition” of our own forms of thought. Ultimately, the dualism between sensibility and thought with which Kant started would seem to be abolished in favor of a view on which sensibility has been co-opted by the understanding.

Hughes’s aim in her book is to show that while there are isolated passages in Kant that invite an “impositionalist” reading, careful consideration of the entirety of his corpus, particularly in light of the third Critique, reveals a more complex account of the relation between mind and world, one that she describes alternately as “pluralist” or “dynamic”. On a “dynamic” reading the categories can have application to objects only through a cooperative engagement between the separate faculties of sensibility and understanding, an engagement that requires the mediation of the imagination. On an “impositionalist” reading, since it is a “fait accompli”, as Hughes puts it, that the categories are involved even in the reception of an object through sensibility, there is no mediating work for the imagination to perform. Thus, for Hughes the difference between the two readings hinges on the different roles that each reading envisions for the imagination. For the impositionalist, the imagination is nothing more than the faculty of the understanding itself, considered under one of its aspects, namely, under the aspect of its application to intuition, as opposed to its employment in mere thought as such. For Hughes, however, the imagination must be accorded some independence from the understanding, and so must possess an independent standing as a genuine third faculty, one that serves to mediate the relation between the world, as it is received by us through our sensibility, and the faculty of understanding.

The first textual obstacle to the sort of account that Hughes wants to give is in the Transcendental Deduction itself, particularly in the second-edition version. In it, as I mentioned, it seems that Kant claims that the categories don’t just, as it were, patrol the precincts of thought but of sensibility as well. But Hughes argues, in chapter 4 of the book, that Kant isn’t claiming there that a synthesis according to the categories is presupposed by anything that we receive in sensibility. Rather, he is best read as making the more limited claim that if anything we receive in sensibility is to have the standing of a cognition, it must conform to the categories. That would still leave room for the imagination to play an essential role in preparing what we receive through sensibility for cognition. The categories don’t apply to the objects we receive in sensibility “just like that”; rather, the possibility of their application to objects is something that must itself be explained by appeal to the mediating function of the imagination, an explanation that Kant refers to as belonging to what he called “the subjective deduction”. Nonetheless, Hughes acknowledges that such a mediating function for the imagination is for the most part suppressed in Kant’s discussion of the imagination in the Deduction, where the imagination is largely depicted as an operation of the understanding. There, the “subjective deduction” takes a back seat to the “objective deduction”.

According to Hughes, the dynamic picture surfaces most strongly in three different areas of Kant’s thought. The first is his view, elaborated in the pages of the Transcendental Analytic that follow the Transcendental Deduction, that the categories have application only to empirical objects, and so require for their application to objects, the mediation of empirical concepts. This topic is taken up in chapter 6. The second is the view, presented in the Introduction to the Critique of the Power of Judgment, that the power of judgment — in its “reflective” rather than its “determining” employment — is able to function in relative independence from the guidance of concepts, and furnishes a standard of its own that must be employed in the search for ever greater unity in our empirical knowledge and in our search for empirical concepts. This is the topic of chapter 7. The third area is in the discussion of the judgment of taste, where Kant explains the universal validity of these judgments by arguing that the feeling of pleasure on which they are based exhibits a harmony of the cognitive faculties in their free play, the very relation between the faculties that is the “subjective condition of cognition in general”. This view is taken up in chapters 5 and 8.

For Hughes it is above all in the account of aesthetic judgment that we see the fullest development of Kant’s dynamic picture of the mind’s relation to the world, for it is aesthetic judgment that reveals what she calls “a synthesis in process”, the cooperation of the separate faculties of understanding and imagination that makes up the “subjective condition of cognition in general”. In ordinary cognition we are typically aware only of the result of the process by which a cognition is formed, not the actual process itself. This is because in ordinary cognition the unity that we find in the imagination is immediately brought under a concept. However, an aesthetic object resists capture in terms of concepts and yet engages the imagination so as to be suggestive of the unity that the understanding needs to find if it is to bring the object under a concept. In aesthetic experience our cognitive faculties engage with each other freely, so we can be aware of this mutual engagement of our faculties for its own sake. In this context Hughes attempts to resolve a much-discussed dilemma concerning the relationship between aesthetic and cognitive judgment. If the harmony of the cognitive faculties that underlies the judgment that something is beautiful is the same as that which is required for cognition, then it looks like Kant is committed to the paradoxical view that everything is beautiful. Nevertheless if the aesthetic harmony of the faculties is distinct from that which is required for cognition, then it is unclear why we should think, as Kant does, that it is universally communicable. Hughes argues that these options do not exhaust the field: aesthetic judgment is both distinctive and also “systematically connected” with cognitive judgment. For her the key is to conceive of the harmony of the faculties as a heightened version of the relation of the faculties that is required for “cognition in general”.

Hughes has, I think, written a fascinating book, one that serves as a helpful and thought-provoking guide through the relatively neglected “subjective” side of Kant’s account of cognition. In particular, she makes the convincing case that the impositionalist picture is based on a misunderstanding. It is one thing to say that the categories are constitutive of what Kant calls “the relation of a representation to an object”, constitutive of anything’s counting as a representation of an object, or, perhaps, of anything’s counting as a representation of something as objective. But it is another to say that the categories are guaranteed application to an object, come what may, for there are also what could be described as enabling conditions on the application of the categories, conditions that would have to be met for the categories to be applicable to objects. Among these conditions are that an object affect our sensibility, that the manifold that results from such affection be synthesized by the imagination, and as Hughes stresses, that the synthesis engage our faculty of understanding. Spelling out such enabling conditions is an appealing way of understanding what Kant called “the subjective deduction”, and Hughes is surely right to insist on the importance of appreciating the place that the subjective deduction, so understood, has in filling out Kant’s picture of the relation between mind and world.

There remain, however, some important questions that to my mind are not fully enough addressed. Among these are questions about how we are to conceive of the relation between the harmony of the faculties and cognitive judgment. Hughes’s characterization of aesthetic judgment as disclosing “a synthesis in process” suggests that the process of the imagination that we are aware of in an aesthetic judgment is one that would, as she puts it, “in other circumstances”, lead to actual cognition. But then when we make an aesthetic judgment are we simply “anticipating” that the process that is taking place in us would under “certain other circumstances” in fact lead to cognition? Among other things if that is the relation between the “synthesis in process” and cognition, it is hard to see how an appeal to the former could account for the universal validity that Kant assumes is a feature of aesthetic judgment. After all, as Paul Guyer and others have pointed out, it seems to be possible that the synthesis that in one person leads to cognition may not do so in someone else. This seems to be a problem that confronts any view on which the harmony of the faculties is identified with some kind of mental process that leads up to cognition.

In any case that way of speaking about the harmony of the faculties doesn’t seem to square with Kant’s speaking of the harmony as exhibiting an independent standard of the possibility of cognition. What the free lawfulness of the imagination is supposed to give us is an awareness of the possibility of cognition. Is it enough here to say that the activity of the imagination is suggestive of a possible cognition? For example, a half-built chair can be suggestive of a chair, or the ruins of a castle suggestive of a castle — but that is only because when we are aware of these objects we already have in mind a fully built chair, or an intact castle. And so we might think with regard to cognition as well. The activity of the imagination is suggestive of cognition, because we already have in mind actual cognitions we have had and the imaginative activity they involved. But then the activity of the imagination wouldn’t give us the possibility of cognition; rather, it would assume it. However, the harmony of the faculties exhibited by an aesthetic judgment is supposed to give us a standard for the possibility of cognition; it is supposed to exhibit the subjective conditions of cognition in general. This requires that we can’t measure it by the standard of an actual cognition. We speak of a process as realizing a cognition because we already have in mind an idea of what the process is supposed to realize. Once we abstract from the “result”, it could be asked, what grasp do we have of the process as a cognitive one?

Hughes is well aware that the free harmony of the faculties is supposed to constitute an independent standard of the possibility of “cognition in general”. Nevertheless to my mind the difficulties involved in so conceiving it are not sufficiently acknowledged in her discussion. As I see it, the central difficulty is that the standard of the possibility of cognition in general is something that cannot in principle be formulated in advance of any sensory encounter with the world, and so can only be exhibited in such an encounter. But that requires that what is simply given to us, and so what in one respect is contingent with respect to our understanding, serve as a standard for what can be cognizable for the understanding. Such a standard can’t simply be given to us, but neither is it something to which the understanding can have access prior to any actual experience. It is a standard that is supposed to be given expression by the feeling of pleasure, rather than by a representation, but what is it to which the feeling of pleasure is supposed to give expression? How are we to conceive of a standard that is at once contingent and yet “lawful” for the understanding? How, ultimately, are we to conceive of the cooperative relationship between our cognitive faculties that is supposed to give us the possibility of cognition in general? Despite all that Hughes says, I still found myself feeling in need of an answer to this basic question.