Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: An Introduction and Interpretation

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James R. O'Shea, Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: An Introduction and Interpretation, Acumen, 2012, 236pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652792.

Reviewed by David Landy, San Francisco State University


James O'Shea has produced a clear, responsible, and compelling introduction to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, perfectly pitched at the undergraduate student of philosophy encountering the Critique for the first time. It begins, as Kant himself indicated that an exoteric presentation of the Critique should, with the Antinomies, and proceeds from there through the standard fare of the Transcendental Aesthetic, Transcendental Deduction, and Principles, building interpretive and argumentative momentum as it goes. It concludes with a discussion of Reason's Ideals as properly serving in the role of regulative principles of empirical investigation. Throughout the first two chapters -- on Kant's terminology and the Antinomies respectively -- O'Shea presents as theory-neutral a reading of the relevant texts as possible, highlighting important debates and source materials as he goes. As the book delves into more controversial territory, O'Shea of necessity becomes more partisan, relying on a line of interpretation of the Critique that has its origin in the previous century with Wilfrid Sellars and which has been gaining prominence again over the last two decades (although he continues to note controversial theses as he presents them).

For those familiar with Jay Rosenberg's Accessing Kant: A Relaxed Introduction to the Critique of Pure Reason, itself an excellent introduction to the Critique for more advanced students of philosophy, it might be helpful to think of O'Shea's introduction as the companion volume to Rosenberg's. Insofar as O'Shea allows himself some interpretive license in the latter half of his book, his commitment to a broadly Sellarsian approach to Kant's text becomes clear, and this is something that he shares with Rosenberg (along with a talent for making clear and compelling some of Kant's most obscure arguments).1 One could easily, as I plan on doing, use O'Shea's guide for undergraduate courses and Rosenberg's for graduate courses.

As mentioned, O'Shea's book doesn't exactly begin with the Antinomies, which is unfortunate, because Kant may very well have been right in thinking that beginning there would make for a captivating introduction to the Critical system. Although this is O'Shea's announced strategy, we will have to wait for the next brave soul to actually give it a try. Instead, O'Shea begins with a ground-laying chapter that addresses in a very responsible and methodical way the important terminological distinctions and thereby also the general framework with which Kant operates in the Critique: analytic-synthetic, a priori-a posteriori, noumena-phenomena, etc. One certainly cannot object to proceeding in this way as so many introductions to the Critique do (as Kant himself does), and some of the material here, specifically the discussion of the difference between the role of theoretical reason and the role of practical reason, bookends nicely with the concluding chapter of the book, but the announcement that the book would begin with material sure to captivate even the reader with just a casual interest in philosophy goes unfulfilled in the Introduction and first chapter. It is not until the second chapter, which treats both of Kant's dogmatic alarm clocks -- Hume's skeptical challenge and the Antinomies -- that that promise is fulfilled.

In that second chapter, as in the Introduction and first chapter, O'Shea sticks fairly closely to what might considered the standard introductory line, especially on Hume, although again he does an excellent job of highlighting where controversy arises and where to find philosophers addressing those controversies. Where O'Shea allows himself the liberty of more robust interpretation is precisely in the places where one would hope: where Kant's explicit treatment of an issue seems particularly susceptible to an obvious or classic objection. Consider, for example, O'Shea's treatment of Russell's objection to Kant on infinite totalities:

But as Bertrand Russell and others have pointed out in objection to Kant (cf. Russell [1914] 1956: 123), the Cantorian conception of infinity that would later be (and is now) widely accepted in mathematics does not build into the concept of infinity, as Kant's conception of infinity does, the idea of an infinitely "successive synthesis" of cognition that cannot be "traversed" within the limitations of an "empirical regress" of possible sense experience. . . . But once the relevant mathematical notions are properly freed from the various experiential limitations that Kant mistakenly places upon them, these critics suggest, the cosmologist's application of them to physical reality need not generate any antinomies at all.

This is certainly an important matter of controversy, one which quickly runs beyond what we can properly explore here. But if the reader is interested in further researching this particular issue, one point to bear in mind is that Kant's concern here is not with the content of mathematical representations per se, nor even with the content of reason's totalizing ideas per se. His concern, rather, is with how far we can really intelligibly conceive our ineliminably temporal and perspectival understanding of objects to reach, when that understanding is thought of (as in the Antinomies) as being problematically extended to comprehend the spatiotemporal cosmos as a whole. Some commentators have defended Kant by arguing that in this epistemological context his arguments against the possibility of any coherent understanding of the sorts of 'infinite given magnitudes' required by the Antitheses do succeed in raising important issues (cf. e.g. Allison 2004, Buroker 2006, and Posy 1983). Similar points of this kind might also be made in relation to other fascinating and worthwhile speculations as to how Kant's various views should be evaluated in light of subsequent developments in mathematics and natural science (for example, in relation to the 'Big Bang' theory of the ultimate origin or 'beginning' of our entire spatiotemporal universe). (154-5)

This treatment strikes me as exactly the kind of quick interpretive line that is appropriate to this form of introduction. It clearly presents the objection, offers a line of interpretation that has the potential to solve the problem, points to the relevant literature, and ends with a provocation to further thinking. This is the sort of treatment that O'Shea presents throughout the book: he presents Kant's position, notes objections and rival interpretations where relevant, and does an elegant job of guiding the reader to what he takes to be the proper way through. The effect I would expect this to have on undergraduate readers is to leave them with a sense that while there are interesting, if thorny, issues of Kant interpretation to be worked out, and there are likewise interesting philosophical puzzles in Kant to be thought through, still Kant is very much a philosopher worth reading.

O'Shea takes this kind of approach to Kant's text further in the next three chapters on the Aesthetic, Deduction, and Principles, and in the concluding chapter on Kant's metaphysics of nature. For the purpose of this review, I will focus my attention on the fourth chapter, on the Deduction, the centerpiece of the Critique, and thereby of most introductions to it. Further, it is here, as well as in the fifth chapter, that O'Shea's own philosophical commitments come more into view, and so where those in search of an introduction to the Critique to use with students will want to tread most carefully.

O'Shea's chapter on the Transcendental Deduction -- it will cover both versions, which he takes to be roughly equivalent treatments of the same material with differing emphases -- begins with a review of what prompts Kant to feel the need to produce such a thing (i.e., Hume). It then touches on the Metaphysical Deduction, emphasizing the primacy of judgments over ideas in representation, and gesturing at, but not pushing hard towards, a contemporary-inferentialist-influenced reading of the kind that one finds briefly in Brandom's Tales of the Mighty Dead, and elsewhere.2 This is followed by a section on the A-Deduction and a section on the B-Deduction that together present Kant as arguing for a thesis of co-representation: representing a world of objects of experience encountered from a perspective in space and time requires representing oneself as the single subject of experiences persisting through time and vice versa. The emphasis here on Kant as putting forth an account of mental representation is, again, in line with a recent "return to Sellars" movement in Kant studies,3 and the particular theory of mental representation that O'Shea presents is likewise Sellarsian in the sense that it is "fraught with ought," i.e., normative through and through. Here I will let O'Shea's text speak for itself.

What Kant is addressing here is what philosophers call the 'intentional content' or the 'objective purport' of an experience or thought. . . . The key question at this stage of Kant's analysis is this: how then do we conceive that any particular succession of our experiences is the way that it is because it is the cognition of an object that is distinct from and determinative of those experiencings . . . Kant's answer, as I read him, is this. When we apply any general concept to experience, such as the concept of a house or a line, what we are applying, as Kant tells us, is a rule, and in the case of a priori concepts and principles in particular, he calls it a law (A113). . . . Conceptual rules or norms play this role by 'binding down' our representations in the sense of committing us to combine our actual and possible representations of the object only in ways that accord with the rules implicit in the concept of that kind of object. (138-9)

I should now say that I think O'Shea gets this exactly right, and his prior and subsequent presentation of this way of understanding the Deduction is clear and compelling. On the other hand, there are those who would resist this kind of interpretation, and would therefore likely prefer an introductory text more in line with their own thinking about the Critique. So be it. For those of us on the side of the right and the good here, one could not hope for a more satisfactory introduction to this very rich, but difficult line of thought in the Critique. Here, then, is O'Shea presenting the co-representation thesis in the service of which Kant puts his normative theory of mental representation:

So the transcendental unity of apperception -- the unity or 'oneness' of human self-consciousness -- is according to Kant a "form of representation" . . . But Kant's unique contention has been that this form of representation is an achievement of representational unity in our thinking and experiencing that stands or falls, in one systematic a priori conceptual package, with our ability to represent a world of objects that are related and combined in ways that are thus represented as independent of our own apprehensions of them. So whether one begins 'from below' with our sensory apprehensions or 'from above' with the 'I think' of apperception, Kant's conclusion is that the possibility of experience, when correctly analyzed as presupposing a certain synthetic unity over time in the ways discussed above, entails that the following two theses mutually condition or imply one another (148)

The idea here, of course, is that in order to represent a manifold of representations as being the result of an encounter with an object, one must subject that manifold to a concept-qua-inferential-rule, and to subject that manifold to a rule, one must think of all of the representations contained in that manifold as being the representations of a single subject of experience persisting through time. The flipside being that so thinking of objects turns out to be the only way to so think of oneself (precisely because, as O'Shea points out, the representation of the self is not the representation of any object, but only a form of representation). The trouble in writing a short summary of O'Shea's interpretive line here is that he has already done such a good job of presenting that line himself in a maximally accessible way, that one hesitates to try to condense it even further.

It is worth noting that the final piece of the co-representation thesis above -- that the representation of the self is a mere form of representation -- is a thesis made most explicit by Kant farther along in the Critique in the Paralogisms. Before moving on to his discussion of the Principles, O'Shea pauses for a section on this thesis and the Paralogisms, which is quite helpful in making clear an otherwise obscure, but essential, piece of the Deduction.4

I will conclude with a brief note about the next and final substantive chapter, which is on the Principles. The unifying theme of this chapter is O'Shea's presentation of each of the Principles as what he calls Kant's application-deductions, which he writes have the following general form:

His arguments typically begin by highlighting certain purely formal features of our pure a priori intuition of time (and of space) that have already been investigated in the Aesthetic, the Deduction and the Schematism. Kant then explores the question of how it is possible -- as we know from the Deduction that it must be -- for such purely formal features of our spatiotemporal intuition to be empirically represented in the objects or 'appearances' that we encounter in sense experience. (165)

This simple form is what structures O'Shea's, again clear and compelling, discussions of the Principles, which finally lead him to conclude of the Transcendental Analytic as a whole that,

For my money it would be difficult to find any other stretch of argument in the history of philosophy to match the profundity of [this] long chain of argument . . . Not that I think that all of it is right. But I think enough of it is right, warts and all, that, as continually transposed into new keys, it continues to represent one of the most compelling outlooks in philosophy today. (204)

For my money, that is the kind of note on which one wants to leave undergraduates upon completing their first encounter with the Critique. Through to the end, O'Shea's introduction strikes just the right balance between neutral presentation of material, interpretive insight, highlighting of problems and puzzles, pointers to solutions, and motivations for the next generation of Kant scholars to continue working on all of these.

1 Rosenberg was O'Shea's dissertation advisor at the University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill. Sellars was Rosenberg's advisor at the University of Pittsburgh.

2 R. Brandom, Tales of the Mighty Dead. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2002. W. Sellars, Science and Metaphysics. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Company, 1967. J. Rosenberg, Accessing Kant. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005. B. Longuesse, Kant and the Capacity to Judge. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2001.

3 The Kant-qua-conceptualist vs. Kant-qua-non-conceptualist debate is currently at the center of this movement, with McDowell serving as the arch-conceptualist, and Sellars (when understood correctly), Hanna, Ginsborg, and Allais the most prominent non-conceptualists. McDowell, J. Having the World in View. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2009. Sellars, (1967). R. Hanna, "Kantian Nonconceptualism," Philosophical Studies, 137 (2008): 41-64. L. Allais, "Kant, Non-Conceptual Content and the Representation of Space," Journal of the History of Philosophy, 47, 3 (2009): 383-413.

4 This is another, although smaller, way that Sellars' influence shows. Sellars along with Kemp Smith were the first to recognize the importance of the Paralogisms for understanding the Deduction. W. Sellars, ". . . This I or he or it (the thing) which thinks . . . " Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 44 (1970-1971): 5-31.