Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: Background Source Materials

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Eric Watkins (ed., tr.), Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: Background Source Materials, Cambridge UP, 2009, 410pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521787017.

Reviewed by Julian Wuerth, Vanderbilt University


Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: Background Source Materials is a collection of mostly first-time translations of works by nine of Kant's influential philosophical contemporaries in Germany, edited and translated by Eric Watkins. It is an invaluable resource for understanding the specific early modern philosophical context in which Kant worked and, in turn, Kant's Critique of Pure Reason and his philosophy more broadly.

We can approach the question of the value of this volume by addressing another interesting question first. Who is in a better position to understand Kant's philosophy: his 18th Century contemporaries or today's scholars? As we move further from Kant's day and age, we have the noteworthy advantage over Kant's contemporaries of having more of Kant's thought available to us. Starting in 1900, the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Sciences (as it is called today, but which had other names in the past) began its massive project of collecting in one series all of Kant's recorded thought. The works that were published during Kant's lifetime were included in this collection, held in volumes 1-9, but these works take up less than one third of the total collection. The remainder of the collection includes Kant's personal notes and his drafts of various works, his correspondence, and his students' notes on his lectures. Most of the first sixteen volumes were published before 1914, volumes 17 through 22 between 1926 and 1942, and volumes 23 through 29 between 1955 and the present, with part of volume 26 still due (the first part was made available in 2009). This gives today's scholars a big advantage over Kant's contemporaries in understanding Kant's philosophy, even if some of the sets of students' notes on Kant's lectures were circulating during and after Kant's lifetime and even if a select few individuals were in correspondence with Kant. What's more, even during Kant's lifetime, his published works were scattered across forty years and many different journals and publishers, whereas the Akademie edition presents Kant's recorded thought in one handy series. Finally, today's scholars have the benefit of over two hundred years of Kant scholarship.

So does this decide the question in favor of today's scholars? Not yet. One clear disadvantage that today's scholars have is that we stand at an increasing remove from Kant's day and age and the ideas that were "in the air" as he worked. What were the most important questions of the day, what was the range of positions taken in response to them, which of these were relatively standard, which were the outliers, what were the nuances of these positions, etc. Of course, we can still learn a great deal about this. One important way is through Kant's recorded thought. While Kant says notoriously little about his contemporaries in his published works, he says quite a lot about them in his lectures, his reflections, and his correspondence. Here we gain a good sense of the positions that Kant thought were widely accepted, which of these he thought were important, and which Kant saw himself responding to and in what way. Traditionally, however, relatively few Kant scholars outside of Germany have availed themselves of these sources, although it is becoming increasingly common with the introduction and expansion of the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, which has translated and continues to translate large swaths of Kant's recorded thought into English, including a volume on Kant's scientific writings that Watkins is currently editing. Of course, to know whether Kant is being fair to his contemporaries and predecessors in what he says is another matter, as is acquiring a rich sense of what his contemporaries and predecessors thought, and for this we need to look at their philosophy directly. There are also plenty of places in Kant's recorded thought where Kant responds to his contemporaries without saying as much, and here a familiarity with their views can be very helpful to understanding Kant.

So, to what extent are their views available to Kant's readers? When it comes to early modern figures important to Kant's age and Kant's work such as Descartes, Malebranche, Locke, Leibniz, Newton, Berkeley, and Hume, Kant's readers have plenty of options. There is a broad range of these philosophers' works available in print and, where relevant, in translation. In addition these figures are, not coincidentally, also routinely studied in undergraduate and graduate courses and so are familiar to most readers of Kant's work.

But what about Kant's German contemporaries and predecessors other than Leibniz? Kant was trained by them, corresponded with them, reviewed their work and had his reviewed by them, referred to their philosophy across his recorded thought, incorporated much of what they argued into his own philosophy while departing from it in significant and also subtle ways, arranged his lectures around their works, and so on. Familiarity with their work, in particular, is accordingly extremely helpful to understanding Kant's work. The recently published Dictionary of Eighteenth-Century German Philosophers (edited by Heiner Klemme and Manfred Kuehn, published by Thoemmes Continuum) can be helpful here, as will the forthcoming Kant-Lexikon (edited by Georg Mohr, Jürgen Stolzenberg, and Marcus Willaschek, in consultation with Watkins, Eckart Förster, Klemme, Christian Klotz, Bernd Ludwig, and Peter McLaughlin, published by De Gruyter), which will include entries on all the philosophical figures to whom Kant ever refers. Nonetheless, there is no substitute for reading these philosophers' work, and despite the importance of this work much of it is not available in print in any language, less in German, and far less in English. Not surprisingly, these figures are largely absent from philosophy classes outside of Germany.

It is in addressing this remaining and significant problem that Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: Background Source Materials does today's readers a great service. The strategy of this volume is not to provide a great deal of translated work from just one or two of Kant's German contemporaries but instead an average of about forty pages of the most significant work of nine of Kant's contemporaries. In choosing these authors and works, the volume prioritizes those most important to understanding Kant while being least available to today's readers. The resulting list of authors, in the order in which they appear in the volume, includes Christian Wolff, Martin Knutzen, Alexander Baumgarten, Christian August Crusius, Leonhard Euler, Johann Heinrich Lambert, Marcus Herz, Johann August Eberhard, and Johann Nicolas Tetens.

Watkins begins with a short preface describing the rationale for his selection of materials. He then provides an overview of the included authors and their work, as well as an explanation for his ordering of the selections. There also are two to three pages introductions for each of the authors which briefly sketch the life of the philosopher in question, provide an overview of his work in philosophy and its place in the German intellectual scene, and then focus more closely on the work included in the volume, being sure to note ways in which this work relates to Kant's philosophy. This is all very carefully and efficiently done and is very helpful. In addition, Watkins adds footnotes throughout the volume alerting readers to related discussions in Kant's Critique of Pure Reason and in some of Kant's works predating the Critique. Finally, he provides a useful concordance, organized according to the sections of the Critique, which lists parallel passages in each of the works in the volume. Once again, this is very helpful, and Watkins is quite thorough: repeatedly as I read and was reminded of parallel passages in Kant's works or in other works by the volume's nine authors, there at the bottom of the page or in the concordance was listed the passage about which I'd been thinking. Watkins also includes a useful bibliography for each of the nine, as well as an index.

In what follows I provide a brief overview of the authors and their included works. In the case of the first work, Christian Wolff's Rational Thoughts on God, the World and the Soul of Human Beings, Also All Things in General, I am more thorough. This enables readers to get a sense of the page-to-page riches to be found in the volume's works, not only as they relate to Kant's Critique or even his philosophy more broadly but also to other early modern philosophy. Many of the views to which I draw attention are shared by other authors in this volume, as there is a good deal of overlap among these works, but for lack of space I will not attempt to specify who shares which positions.

Wolff (1679-1754) incorporated many of the central tenets of Leibniz's philosophy while systematizing and expanding it. In Kant's day Wolff was more influential than Leibniz himself. Kant regularly spoke highly of Wolff, famously referring to him in the Critique as the greatest of the dogmatist philosophers, even though Kant of course rejected much of Wolff's philosophy. Watkins translates excerpts from what is often referred to as Wolff's German Metaphysics, namely, his Rational Thoughts on God, the World and the Soul of Human Beings, Also All Things in General. Wolff is widely recognized as having influenced Kant by supplying him with the division of metaphysics that Kant would follow in his divisions of the Critique's Transcendental Logic. This is the division, first, of metaphysics into general metaphysics and special metaphysics. General metaphysics for Wolff was ontology, and in Kant's hands this would become the Transcendental Analytic. Special metaphysics would be covered by Kant, by contrast, in the Transcendental Dialectic. Wolff in turn divided special metaphysics into three parts, rational psychology, rational cosmology, and rational theology; Kant followed this division with his chapters on the Paralogisms, Antinomies, and the Ideal. But Wolff influenced Kant's thought profoundly in many other ways; throughout the excerpts that Watkins supplies we see passage after passage of doctrines that Kant refers to and usually critiques in what is often his unpublished recorded thought.

Following are some examples of the many connections between Wolff's and Kant's thought. To begin, in the first chapter of the German Metaphysics, Wolff discusses our cognition of our own existence. Here Wolff presents a version of sorts of Descartes' cogito. Interestingly, though, Wolff presents his version explicitly in the syllogistic form that Kant critiques in the Paralogisms in reference to Descartes, even though Descartes, at least in his second set of replies to objections to the Meditations, explains that there is no deduction by means of a syllogism in the cogito, just a self-evident recognition of our existence by a simple intuition of the mind. Moving to Chapter 2, "On the First Principles of Our Cognition … ," in Section 12 we see Wolff's lack of recognition of the distinction between real and logical possibility that Kant attacked from his earliest writings onwards, and in sections 17 through 21 Wolff's version of Leibniz's principle of the identity of indiscernibles that Kant would attack in the Amphiboly. In Section 46, Wolff lays out a Leibnizian account of space that Kant would also, of course, reject in the Aesthetic. In Section 76, Wolff presents the Leibnizian view that all composites require simples, a view that Kant would also reject as it applied to objects in space. In Section 117, we see a distinction between powers and capacities that Kant would largely incorporate into his own philosophy.

In Chapter Three, "On the Soul in General, Namely, What We Perceive of It," Wolff presents his empirical psychology. Kant would later criticize the rationalists for including empirical psychology in metaphysics, explaining that, while all the teachings of metaphysics must come from within the soul, our inner states sensed in inner sense are still just as empirically accessed as the outer states that we sense by means of outer sense, and that empirical psychology is accordingly by no means a part of metaphysics. Here we find Wolff including empirical psychology within his metaphysics. This empirical psychology then presents a description of our faculties of mind that resembles the descriptions presented by many other rationalists and empiricists, which superficially resembles the descriptions Kant himself presents throughout his philosophy. In sections 277 and 282, Wolff, however, maintains that the distinction between understanding and the senses is one in degree only, not in kind, a position that Kant criticizes throughout his philosophy from the 1760s onwards as a foundational error. In this chapter, Wolff also lays out the basics of a theory of action, and in section 492 we see Wolff's account of the good that Kant would attack in his ethics, in the preface to the Groundwork. On Wolff's account, our sensible desires are not distinct in kind from our intellectual motives; they are instead the result of our "indistinct representations of the good," different from our intellectual (and distinct) representations of the good in degree only. Thus Wolff does not see the moral law issuing from a source different in kind from sensibility, as does Kant, who sees the origin of the moral law in pure reason. And moral choice, for Wolff, will in turn not be limited to choice on motives presented by reason. Instead, in Kant's words, Wolff will "consider motives irrespective of any difference in their source … [considering] nothing but their relative strength or weakness" (Groundwork preface).

In sections 514-522, Wolff presents a compatibilist account of freedom closely related to Kant's early account of freedom in the New Elucidation, which Kant would soon reject. Moving to Chapter 5, "On the Essence of the Soul and of a Spirit in General," we find reflections on the preconditions for self-consciousness that raise, in crude fashion, some of the questions that Kant would aggressively pursue in the Deduction. And in Section 741, Wolff addresses the problem confronted by nearly all of the volume's authors, whether the soul has more than one basic power, concluding that the soul's simplicity requires that it have only one power.

Alexander Baumgarten (1714-1762) is the third author (Knutzen is second) in this volume, and here Watkins supplies us with almost a quarter of Baumgarten's Metaphysica. This work is of obvious and great importance in understanding Kant because Kant himself used it as the textbook for his lectures on metaphysics for approximately four decades. Students' notes on these lectures show Kant engaging with this text, often critically, and sometimes section by section. Many of Kant's Reflexionen also come from Kant's personal copy of this book. A reprint of the fourth edition (1757) of Baumgarten's Metaphysica is included in volumes 15 and 17 of the Akademie edition, and Adickes often notes (in Akademie volumes 15, 17, and 18) the number of the section in Kant's copy of Baumgarten's Metaphysica next to which Kant's comments were written. For this reason, I have always been especially puzzled that no one has translated this source into English. There is a German translation of this text by one of Baumgarten's students, Georg Friedrich Meier, but it is a translation of a later version whose section numbers do not correspond to the section numbers of the earlier version and Adickes' references to them. In the sections included in this volume, Baumgarten covers much of the same terrain as Wolff, in Ontology, Cosmology, Psychology, and Theology. Of special importance, however, are Baumgarten's views on substances and accidents, which Kant repeatedly attacks and which help to shape Kant's views in the First Analogy.

The second author in this volume, Martin Knutzen (1713-1751), was the professor who most deeply influenced Kant during his time as a student at the University of Konigsberg. In his writings he offered a blend of Lockean, Leibnizian/Wolffian, and Pietist views and was especially influential in his defense of the causal theory of physical influx against the pre-established harmony and occasionalist alternatives, offering this theory with the special purpose of explaining mind-body interaction. We find this defense in his 1745 System of Efficient Causes (which is a reprint of his 1735 Philosophical Commentary on the Commerce of the Body and the Mind Explained by Physical Influx), excerpts of which Watkins provides. In his 1755 New Elucidation and 1770 Inaugural Dissertation, Kant would follow Knutzen's views on physical influx and his rejection of the alternatives quite closely. Kant's later, Critique views on causation, in the Analogies, the Amphiboly, and the Antinomies, also are indebted to this account. Kant, however, does not go so far as to understand mind-body interaction as something that ultimately transpires in time and space, like Knutzen, who argues that the mind is in a place and is surrounded in space by the body's monads. This volume also contains excerpts from Knutzen's 1744 Philosophical Treatise on the Immaterial Nature of the Human Soul (which is the translation of the 1741 Latin Philosophical Commentary on the Individual Nature or Immortality of the Human Mind). Here we find many of the unrestrained rationalist views on the soul's immortality that Kant would reject in the Paralogisms but also some of the more moderate views that he would share.

Christian August Crusius (1715-1775) was a Pietistic philosopher who is well known for his opposition to Wolffian philosophy and, in particular, Wolff's views on freedom, rejecting Wolff's view that humans are subject to the principle of the determining ground, in favor of the freedom of indifference. Kant famously and explicitly grapples with this view in his 1755 New Elucidation, defending a compatibilist, pre-deterministic account against Crusius that he would later abandon. His views on ideal versus real existence and space and time were also instrumental to Kant's development, and in Watkins' translations of excerpts from Crusius's 1745 Sketch of the Necessary Truths of Reason we see Crusius writing about all of these topics.

Leonhard Euler's (1707-1783) Letters to a German Princess (1768) is, to my knowledge, the only source in this volume other than the correspondence between Marcus Herz and Kant to have previously been translated into English. These wide-ranging, thoughtful, and clear letters, which the philosopher and mathematician Euler wrote to Frederick the Great's niece, often question or attack the Wolffian-Leibnizian philosophy in a manner different from what we find in Crusius's work. While Euler's influence on Kant is not commonly noted or obviously pivotal on any central issue, we nonetheless find traces of Euler's probing discussions throughout Kant's published and unpublished thought, on topics ranging from the theory of monads, to the infinite divisibility of matter, to the merely virtual location of the soul.

Kant corresponded with Johann Heinrich Lambert (1748-1777) between 1765 and 1770. His great respect for Lambert is evident in his letters. In 1765 the normally reserved Kant tells Lambert that he holds him to be "the greatest genius in Germany, a man capable of important and enduring contributions to the investigations on which I too am working". He later says (in his famous February 21, 1770 letter to Herz) that a single letter from Mendelssohn or Lambert is worth more than ten average reviews. Lambert and Kant repeatedly mention the agreement of their ways of thinking about the proper method of metaphysics. They toy with the idea of collaborating on a work. In 1770 Kant excuses his delays in writing back to Lambert on the basis of the reflections brought on by Lambert's views. Lambert and Mendelssohn both wrote Kant letters in response to his Inaugural Dissertation, which Herz had delivered to them in Berlin, in which each raised the same objection to Kant's views on time: because changes in inner sense are real, so too must be time. Kant's respect for Lambert in these letters is grounded not only on the content of their correspondence but also on Lambert's published work. This volume includes excerpts from Lambert's 1761 "Treatise on the Criterion of Truth" and also his 1764 New Organon, to which Kant refers when expressing agreement about their views on the method of metaphysics. In these works we see Lambert's original inquiries into epistemology and metaphysics that combine elements of the philosophy of Descartes, Wolff, Leibniz, Locke, and Euclid.

Marcus Herz (1747-1803) is often remembered as Kant's favorite student. He and Kant remained in close contact until Kant's death. Herz, who had moved to Berlin after studying in Berlin, acted as Kant's link to the vibrant intellectual community of Berlin, and in particular to Mendelssohn. As Watkins points out, the self-effacing nature of Herz's letters to Kant might lead one to assume modest talents on his part, but instead we find him to be a subtle thinker. This of course would make sense, given that Kant chose Herz to defend Kant's Inaugural Dissertation, a choice especially notable when one considers that Herz was a Jew in an academic setting in which discrimination against Jews was common. In this volume Watkins includes excerpts from six of the most important letters exchanged between Herz and Kant, many of which are full of important philosophy and one of which is Kant's most famous letter (mentioned above, from 21 February 1772). While these letters are also available in translation in the Cambridge Edition of the Collected Works of Kant, it is convenient having them here alongside excerpts from Herz's 1771 Observations from Speculative Philosophy. These excerpts reflect Kant's views in the Inaugural Dissertation but also engage with some of the questions with which Kant was wrestling after the Inaugural Dissertation. They at times anticipate the direction Kant would take in answering them.

Johann August Eberhard (1739-1809) is perhaps best known for having provoked Kant into writing his 1790 On a Discovery Whereby Any New Critique of Pure Reason is Made Superfluous by an Older One by arguing that the Critique provided nothing that was not already available in Leibniz's philosophy. This volume contains excerpts from Eberhard's 1776 Universal Theory of Thinking and Sensing. Here we find a potent mixture of views that Kant rejects, with Eberhard repeatedly doing what Kant had complained about in general to Herz in a September 11, 1770 letter: "extremely mistaken conclusions emerge if we apply the basic concepts of sensibility to something that is not at all an object of sense, that is, something thought through a universal or a pure concept of the understanding as a thing or substance in general, and so on." This is especially evident in Eberhard's views on the simplicity of the soul and in his moral psychology.

Johann Nicolas Tetens (1738-1807) is the last author in the volume. The excerpts are from his 1777 Philosophical Essays, which -- as is widely known from Johann Hamann's report -- Kant had at his desk while writing the Critique. Tetens is often referred to as the "German Locke," and here we see why. Like Locke, he conducts a wonderfully rich, levelheaded empirical study of the mind's faculties and the process of knowledge acquisition. While he does not provide transcendental arguments, as Kant would, he nonetheless has the benefit over Locke of writing after exposure to Hume. He pushes up against the limits of empiricism and also, occasionally, pushes back at Hume, setting up problems that Kant would then engage with in his own manner. One important example is his discussion of self-consciousness as it carries over to a discussion of causality and Hume. Here Tetens develops points that Wolff, Knutzen, and Euler related to Kant's eventual Deduction, but Tetens develops these ideas and remaining questions in an especially clear and thorough manner. Another important topic on which Tetens lavishes a good deal of attention is one addressed by many of the philosophers in this volume: the question of the relation of sensibility to understanding and whether these are distinct faculties.

Finally, to some general points. Watkins' translations are consistently accurate and yet very readable. His editorial work throughout is thorough, knowledgeable, and helpful. Perhaps the only real problem with this book is that it leaves one wanting more than the already generous 410 pages. But there are some advantages to not having more at this point: Watkins has done a nice job of selecting works and excerpts from them that are especially important to understanding Kant's philosophy. He has managed through his editorial work to tie this material into a coherent, manageable bundle, and the volume, at its current length, is very reasonably priced. These are the sorts of qualities that will no doubt help this volume retain its appeal, even if its inevitable success leads to more reprints or translations of the works featured in it (or other, related works). One might lament that none of Moses Mendelssohn's work appears in this volume, but, as Watkins points out, Cambridge has already made Mendelssohn's works available elsewhere. Cambridge is to be lauded for supporting such projects.

In sum, this is a great book. In producing it, Watkins has done valuable yeoman's service for both Kant scholars and the broader modern philosophy community. For this we should be grateful. Indeed, I think that this book will likely make the greatest contribution to the understanding of Kant in the English speaking audience since the introduction of the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant. It will help Kant's readers in already-mentioned ways to understand Kant's philosophy and in doing so will also help them recognize the many important yet often subtle ways in which Kant rejects rationalist or empiricist positions even while sharing some of their views or terminology. Watkins' volume should be required reading in any undergraduate or graduate course on the Critique. It would be very useful in courses on other areas of Kant's philosophy and would bring a welcome breath of fresh air in courses on rationalism or empiricism, especially those that tend to be followed by courses on, or centered around, Kant.