Kant's Doctrine of Right: A Commentary

Placeholder book cover

B. Sharon Byrd and Joachim Hruschka, Kant's Doctrine of Right: A Commentary, Cambridge UP, 2010, 336pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521196642.

Reviewed by Georg Cavallar, University of Vienna


In the wake of Schopenhauer's devastating remark, Kant's Doctrine of Right, the Rechtslehre and first part of the Metaphysik der Sitten (1797), had for a long time been regarded as the work of an elderly scholar in decline. Important interpretations since the 1990s by Wolfgang Kersting, Leslie Mulholland, and Allen Rosen, among others, have successfully tried to reverse this picture. Sharon Byrd and Joachim Hruschka follow their assessments, claiming that this is 'Kant's masterpiece on legal and political philosophy', 'highly structured and meticulously formulated', providing a systematic and coherent model to guarantee the rule of law and to ensure peace 'on the national, international and cosmopolitan levels' (p. 1).

Since Kant's text is - to put it mildly - difficult to read and to understand, even in German, Byrd and Hruschka aim at offering a commentary. They have more than succeeded in this task. They start their interpretation with §41 of the Doctrine of Right, which they consider central as it denotes the transition from private to public law, summarizes characteristics of the juridical state (rechtlicher Zustand), and outlines the basic system of rights (Chapter 1). They continue with an original analysis of the three leges, the lex iusti (the law which defines what is legally relevant), the lex iuridica (the legally relevant facts, circumstances and actions to which the lex iusti can be applied), and the lex iustitiae (which views our rights from the perspective of the juridical order; cf. Chapter 2, especially pp. 52, 58f. and 167). Chapter 3 focuses on the 'axiom of external freedom' and the rights derived from this axiom, such as the right to equal treatment under the law. 'The assumption that everyone has a right to external freedom is the logical starting point for Kant's Doctrine of Right' (p. 77). The authors distinguish between a negative and positive aspect, the former denoting 'independence from another's necessitating choice' (p. 92) and the latter the dependence on the rule of law, which implies the postulate of public law: 'In a situation of unavoidable contact with all others, you should leave this state [the state of nature] and move to a juridical state!' (p. 93).

It is one of the strengths of this commentary that Byrd and Hruschka show how Kant systematically unfolded this exeundum-principle (exeundum e statu naturali: the state of nature has to be left) in private law, state law, international and cosmopolitan law (Chapters 4-9). Another strength is the combination of step-by-step analysis with historical contextualization. In particular, the authors emphasize the importance of Gottfried Achenwall's Prolegomena Iuris Naturalis, showing how Kant usually used his terminology and often the concepts behind them (Kant held lectures on Achenwall's natural law doctrine for more than twenty years). Occasionally, the authors analyse how Kant's ideas developed over the years. The remaining chapters deal with contract law, criminal punishment, the relationship between homo phaenomenon and homo noumenon, and the system of rules of imputation.

With their commentary, Byrd and Hruschka make a vital contribution to Kantian studies. I will discuss two issues: the right of revolution, famously denied by Kant, and cosmopolitan law. The authors use the concept of external freedom and its positive aspect to solve the vexing debate about Kant's theory of revolution. Since the postulate of public law demands that we move to a juridical state, Kant's 'prohibition against revolution refers to revolting in a juridical state and not in some despotic state' (p. 77, cf. 90f. and 181-4). In other words, the postulate prohibits destroying a juridical state once established (and returning to the state of nature), but not destroying any state whatsoever. Despotism is defined as a government which is 'simultaneously lawgiving' (Doctrine of Right, §49, cf. p. 184), thus enabling it to make arbitrary decisions.

Unlike many other political philosophers, Kant expanded his inquiry beyond the modern (nation) state. His passages on the right of hospitality, both in Perpetual Peace (1795) and in the Doctrine of Right, have acquired a kind of cult status in recent cosmopolitan literature. Byrd and Hruschka offer a novel and rather sober interpretation of cosmopolitan law, which runs counter to this enthusiastic appropriation. They assert that for Kant, cosmopolitan law is nothing but 'the idea of a perfect World Trade Organization' (p. 7). Kant distinguished among three forms of justice in a juridical state, corresponding to the three leges mentioned above. The iustitia tutatrix amounts to positive legislation to make rights possible. The iustitia commutativa 'represents the public market where people can exercise their rights to external objects of choice by buying and selling them' (p. 69) and makes rights a reality. Finally, the iustitia distributiva represents the judiciary (making rights a necessity): a judge decides with binding force in cases of dispute. According to Byrd and Hruschka, cosmopolitan law refers to commutative justice, the public order for the market beyond state borders. International trade or 'possible commerce' requires a legal framework, 'certain universal laws' (Doctrine of Right, §62, cf. p. 210).

This is an extremely thin version of cosmopolitan law. There are no world citizens, there is no 'unconditional hospitality' à la Derrida, no global and democratic civil society where, in the words of James Bohman, 'each inhabitant of the planet is elevated to the position of international "magistrate"' and, in the words of Hedley Bull, the system of states is swept 'into limbo'. According to Byrd and Hruschka, Kant's international law refers to iustitia tutatrix and iustitia distributiva, to public legislation and to an international court with enforceable and binding decisions. His ideal is a state of nation states (Völkerstaat) as opposed to the universal monarchy, international anarchy, or the federation of republics (pp. 188 and 200-5). The Völkerstaat requires states to submit themselves to 'public coercive laws' (according to Perpetual Peace), and is a regulative idea which cannot be fully realized, but continually approximated (Doctrine of Right, §61). By contrast, cosmopolitan law offers an ordered commutative justice in the absence of a fully achieved international juridical state with iustitia tutatrix and iustitia distributiva.

Consequently, an ordered iustitia commutativa and thus "cosmopolitan law" can exist on the international level in the absence of a iustitia tutatrix and a iustitia distributiva in a state of nation states. Cosmopolitan law is thus (logically) independent from law in a state of nation states. It requires its own iustitia tutatrix, meaning public law and legislation ordering the international market, the iustitia commutativa, and its own iustitia distributiva, meaning an international trade court which can reach final binding decisions under cosmopolitan law in case of trade disputes (p. 211).

These passages on cosmopolitan law show that occasionally Byrd and Hruschka offer not just a commentary but a vital contribution to ongoing debates, based on a profound knowledge of the overall system of Kant's legal philosophy -- a knowledge that, in this last case, is so often missing in those who just look at the third definitive article on hospitality in Perpetual Peace and are inclined to make far-reaching guesses about the content of this article and the scope of cosmopolitan right.

My criticism of this book is marginal. I would have liked the authors to consider relevant secondary literature more, for instance the work of Pauline Kleingeld. I do not assume that Kant makes the 'presumption of badness' (the translation of the Latin original runs: 'Everyone is presumed to be evil until he provides security for the opposite', Doctrine of Right, §42, cf. pp. 190-3). In §44, Kant discards all anthropological assumptions to justify coercion in a juridical state and claims that it is the mere fact of co-existence, of possible mutual interaction and of each person's private judgement 'to do what seems right and good', which justifies the exeundum-principle. This approach is in agreement with Kant's methodology of a completely isolated metaphysics of morals (without theological, anthropological, etc. elements). The discussion of Kant's arguments in favour of the death penalty is too brief (the principle of equality leads to the law of retribution, which in turn dictates the death penalty for murder, cf. pp. 273-5). It is not at all clear that a state can wage war to coerce its neighbours to enter a juridical state, though a half-sentence suggests just that (cf. Doctrine of Right, §55, beginning).

All this said, the overall achievement of Byrd and Hruschka is outstanding. They really tried hard to make sense of Kant: 'If his theory seemed self-contradictory or nonsensical, impenetrable or simply confused, we assumed it was our problem, and not Kant's' (p. 9). They succeed, and find hidden treasures. The Doctrine of Right, they suggest, is the work of a genius, and we might have just begun to understand this book, especially since the first Critique could provide a key to a fuller understanding (cf. p. 13). Who is up to this task?