Kant's Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary

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Henry E. Allison, Kant's Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary, Oxford University Press, 2011, 377pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199691548.

Reviewed by Dieter Schönecker, University of Siegen


To begin with, I'm not a Kantian. I'm not sure exactly what a Kantian is, but I'm sure I'm not one of these creatures (likewise I'm not sure what an Alpha Centaurian would be, but I'm sure I'm not one myself). On the other hand, as a historian of philosophy, I'm very much interested in what Kant's texts mean. And as I see it, one of the most fascinating things in philosophy is to read how other people read a text that I read myself. What do they, from my perspective, get right? And what do they get wrong? I believe that much of what Henry Allison says about Kant's Groundwork is dubitable; at the same time, I believe that his commentary is the best ever written on the Groundwork: comprehensive, historical, original, argumentatively clear and sharp-witted, critical, very well informed about the ongoing research (though some literature is not reflected), stimulating, patient and (mostly) even rather close to the text. It is easily said that there cannot be too many commentaries on a book as important and difficult as the Groundwork; but, of course, there can be too many, to wit, those that have nothing new to say or say mostly things that are blatantly false or ignorant of the ongoing research (and we have seen commentaries and articles like these over the last decade or so). As one would expect from his earlier work on Kant's philosophy, Allison's commentary is of another caliber.[1]

 It covers the entire Groundwork (including the third chapter on the deduction, which other commentaries have treated in a rather stepmotherly manner), and it does follow the structure of Kant's opus. However, it's not a commentary that comments on each sentence or paragraph step by step. This is not a minor methodological point, because Kant often deals with one and the same topic in different places, and it makes little sense to interpret strictly along the lines of Kant's text. This is not to say that there is anything that should not be commented upon; but as far as the structure of the commentary itself is concerned, a line-by-line commentary often is not helpful. Thus, Allison's commentary falls into four parts: In the first ("Preliminaries"), he deals with the "Preface", including Kant's understanding of what a 'metaphysics of morals' is about, how it relates to common moral understanding, Wolffian "Universal Practical Philosophy" and so-called popular moral philosophy à la Garve. The historical background is difficult and disputed; in any event, I submit that Allison greatly overestimates the influence of Garve's translation of De officiis  (while not mentioning Pistorius at all).

Allison also pays insufficient attention to what exactly Kant's 'method' is. It has almost unanimously been claimed that Kant follows the analytic (regressive) and synthetic (progressive) method as described in the Prolegomena, and to some extent Allison too thinks along these lines. Yet on close reading that cannot be right: In the relevant passage of Kant's preface, the term 'method' refers to the three 'transitions', not to the terms 'analytic' and 'synthetic'; these refer to the 'way' that is taken in the Groundwork. And if Kant did follow the analytic method (in Groundwork I and II), then Groundwork III would need to be analytic as well, given what Kant says on the analytic method in the Prolegomena.

The other three parts of the commentary are on the three chapters of the Groundwork. There is so much going on in Allison's commentary, both with regard to questions of interpretation and of evaluation (critique) that I can only highlight some points that happen to strike me as particularly noteworthy. For instance, it has long been debated what exactly the 'first proposition' concerning duty is. In Groundwork I, Kant refers to a 'second proposition' and a 'third proposition', the latter being a 'Folgerung aus beiden vorigen', but he never identifies a 'first'. Allison discusses several options, arguing that, in any event, the first proposition cannot be about respect ("An action from duty is an action from respect for the moral law" has been proposed as the missing first sentence) because 'respect', he says, is a concept that is and could not be introduced in paragraphs 9-13 ofGroundwork I.  Also, Allison takes it for granted that the third proposition ("Duty is the necessity of an action from respect for the moral law") cannot be reconstructed as the conclusion ('Folgerung') of a deductive argument proper. However, if Kant is serious in speaking of 'Folgerung', how could the term 'respect' not be dealt with when the third proposition says that duty is the necessity of an action done from respect for the moral law? Also, a deductive reading of 'Folgerung' seems very well possible.

Here's a proposal.  First step: All actions from duty are actions from respect for the moral law; subjectively considered, all duties are actions from duty; therefore, subjectively considered, all duties are actions from respect for the moral law. Second step: All necessary actions according to a formal principle a priori are actions according to the necessity of the moral law; objectively considered, all duties are necessary actions according to a formal principle a priori; therefore, objectively considered, all duties are actions according to the necessity of the moral law. Finally, if all duties are actions from respect for the moral law and according to the necessity of the moral law, then duty is the necessity of an action from respect for the moral law; all duties are actions from respect for the moral law and according to the necessity of the moral law; therefore, duty is the necessity of an action from respect for the moral law. (But maybe 'Folgerung' here means 'corollary'; this is a reading that Allison does not consider.)

As for the other crucial element of Groundwork I, the good will, Allison's interpretation very much depends on two assumptions: He takes the good will to be something like the 'character' or 'Denkungsart' of a person, rather than the goodness of a specified instance of (a good) volition. I believe there are textual as well as systematic problems with this. As for the first, if Kant really meant 'character' or 'Denkungsart', why does he hardly ever use these terms? Also, Kant says that the "talents of the mind [and the] qualities of temperament . . .  can also become extremely evil and harmful, if the will that ought to make use of these gifts of nature, and whose peculiar constitution is therefore calledcharacter, is not good" (G: 393). But what does it mean that the will is called 'character' only inasmuch it 'ought to make use of the gifts of nature'? How is this evidence for Allison's interpretation?

As for the systematic question: If the good will is just the character of a person (something relatively firm -- but how firm?), then how are we to understand bad volitions of such a person? Obviously not as the result of a bad character, for then that person would have both a good and a bad character (which makes no sense if one understands character as thegeneral orientation with regard to the moral law). Therefore, there must be such a thing as a bad will that is not identical with a bad character, and then there is an asymmetry between a good will and a bad will, the latter being the bad will behind a bad action, the former being the good character behind good actions. If we have maxims on which we mostly (typically) act, but not always, then there must be genuine actions of ours that are either not based on maxims (which is, according to Allison's second assumption, the incorporation thesis, not possible since, according to it, all genuine actions are based on maxims), or there are actions based on maxims (of a will) held only temporarily. Also, if a good person (one with a good character) can find herself in situations in which her will is not good, why should a bad person not be in situations in which his will (volition) is good? Can one act from duty only if one has the character to act from duty? And does one have such a character if one mostly acts from duty? Can one have a maxim not to do x and still do x often (and how often)? I'm not sure Allison has satisfying answers to these questions, and I'm also not sure that his defence against the well-known (Schillerian) objection is successful. (He does make, however, an entirely convincing case against Allen Wood's interpretation of the good will. By the way, if the incentive is always part of the maxim itself, how can we then formulate maxims that describe pflichtmäßige actions, or maxims of law?)

Groundwork II is, of course, most important when it comes to the categorical imperative and its different formulas. Allison deals with the notorious four examples, and he addresses in detail different approaches and discussions in the literature (false negatives, false positives, and all that). I will not say anything about this except that Allison's analysis is excellent, and that it simply remains to be seen (also in light of Parfit's new magnum opus) what further discussions will bring to light. When it comes to Allison's interpretation of the so-called formula of humanity, I'm not as content with his interpretation. Above all, I believe that he does not really appreciate Kant's concept of an end in itself that is an intrinsic absolute value and as such the ground for the categorical imperative. For instance, Allison says that something that exists as an end in itself is a necessary condition for the categorical imperative, but at the same time he claims that such an end presupposes the categorical imperative (p. 206). Also, Allison falls victim to a grammatical misunderstanding with regard to a passage that he himself calls "crucial" (p. 223) and the brevity of which "makes its interpretation particularly precarious" (ibid.): Kant writes that "rational nature exists as an end in itself" (G. 429); in the two sentences that follow, Kant then says that "es" (it) is a "subjective principle" as well as an "objective principle". Allison refers this 'es' to that proposition about the rational nature as an end in itself; but on close reading, there can be no doubt that it refers to the categorical imperative the ground of which is that principle. (On the other hand, Allison is absolutely right in pointing out -- contra Korsgaard and Wood -- that humanity in the context of the Groundwork is a quality possessed not already by being able to set ends, but by a capacity for morality.)

I would quarrel most with Allison's interpretation of Groundwork III. The problem, as I see it, stems from the standard interpretation according to which Kant argues as follows: Every being with an imperfect free will is under the categorical imperative; every human being has an imperfect free will; therefore, every human being is under the categorical imperative. On the standard reading, the first premise is argued for in sec. 1 of Groundwork III, where Kant says that "a free will and a will under moral laws are the same" (G: 447). The second premise, however, is demonstrated no later than in sec. 3, such that the conclusion would be reached with sec. 3 already; and then sec. 4 -- in which, however, Kant actually delivers the deduction of the categorical imperative -- would play no role. Now, Allison certainly pays more attention to sec. 4 of the Groundwork than almost all others have, and yet he also says that "whatever real work is done in GMS 3 is done in the first three sections" (p. 359).

So a great deal depends on how we understand Kant's famous claim that 'a free will and a will under moral laws are the same'; as he does in his earlier works, Allison calls this Kant's reciprocity thesis (RT). But what does it mean to be 'under' moral laws? Kant holds human beings to be 'under' the categorical imperative inasmuch the moral law is obligatory for them and thus necessitating. But Kant explicitly says that a holy being, to whom the moral law is not an imperative, "would thus stand just as much under objective laws (of the good)" (G: 414). So RT must also be about the free will of a holy being; more importantly, it must also be about the intelligible will of beings (beings like us) that are both members of the world of understanding and the world of sense.  But again, it cannot be about the will of an imperfect being because then the structure of Groundwork III would break down -- though, of course, it is true that imperfect beings are under the categorical imperative.  But this, pace Allison, is not the point of RT and thus is not already demonstrated in sec. 1.

In sec. 4, Kant says several times that "as a mere member of the world of understanding, all my actions would be perfectly in accord with the principle of the autonomy of the pure will" (G: 453); this, I submit, is the basic meaning of RT. The crucial idea of the deduction in sec. 4 is that "I must regard the laws of the world of understanding for myself asimperatives and the actions that accord with this principle as duties" (G: 454); and only as such duties are the moral laws synthetic. It is therefore no surprise that Allison not only has very little to say about the famous circle in sec. 3 (which really is a petitio pricipii rather than a circulus in probando), and it is striking that he does not take into account the last sentence, which resolves the circle:

For now we see that if we think of ourselves as free, then we transport ourselves as members into the world of understanding and cognize the autonomy of the will, together with its consequence, morality; but if we think of ourselves as obligated by duty, then we consider ourselves as belonging to the world of sense and yet at the same time to the world of understanding (G: 453).

The first part of this sentence is a reformulation of RT; Kant says that 'morality' is a 'consequence' of autonomy because the relation between the concept of an intelligible will and the moral law is analytic. It follows from an analysis of that concept, and this is also why the moral law in this context is analytic rather than synthetic. Allison holds that the moral law is always synthetic; but the very idea of the 'syntheticity' of the moral law is bound to its imperativeness, and since there are no imperatives to holy beings, the moral law with regard to them cannot be synthetic either. The second part of the sentence, however, makes clear why for sensuous-rational beings the moral law is an imperative that is in need of a deduction. It is one thing to be free, another to be obligated. And precisely this very thought is also expressed in the last sentence of sec. 4; and again, Allison doesn't relate it to RT: "The moral 'ought' is thus his own necessary volition as a member of an intelligible world and is thought of him as an 'ought' only insofar as he at the same time considers himself as a member of the sensible world" (G: 453). In sec. 5, Kant repeats his claim that the positive concept of freedom is that of "a causality of reason, which we call a 'will', so to act that the principle of the actions is in accord with the essential constitution of a rational cause, i.e., the condition of the universal validity of the maxim as a law" (G: 458). With regard to this passage, Allison himself writes: "This is a statement of the moral law rather than the categorical imperative because it is a descriptive law that describes the modus operandi of a pure will" (p. 355). But then RT really is about this modus operandi, not about the reciprocity thesis.

This commentary, being a monograph, shows the severe drawbacks of mere collections of essays ('companions', 'guides', etc.)  They have some value, but they must not replace comprehensive books written by one mind (and they do tend to replace monographs if there is pressure to publish papers rather than books). Allison's commentary is a masterpiece. It sets a very high standard for any future work on the Groundwork, and it will be hard to surpass.

[1] There are, however, some printing and editing defects: a typeface that is unpleasant to read, too many typographical errors and misquotations, and a confused and incomplete index.