Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary

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Jens Timmermann, Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A Commentary, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 189pp., $91.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862820.

Reviewed by Sean P. Walsh, University of Minnesota, Duluth


Jens Timmermann's book is an important commentary on what is probably Kant's most read and taught book.  The editorial summary of the book on the first page is apt:

This commentary explains Kant's arguments paragraph by paragraph, and also contains an introduction, a synopsis of the argument, six short interpretive essays on key topics of the Groundwork, and a glossary of key terms.  It will be an indispensable resource for anyone wishing to study Kant's ethical theory in detail.

Timmermann's book is useful for both pedagogy and research, and so anyone interested in either should pick up this book.  For the researcher, there are contemporary works referenced in the footnotes for many of the important paragraphs of the Groundwork, a more extensive bibliography for each of the three sections of the Groundwork, and an extensive bibliography at the end of the book.  Timmermann sometimes spends pages detailing various interpretations of a short paragraph in Kant's work, so anyone wanting to work on a passage in Kant's Groundwork is likely to find Timmermann's book a great resource.  Throughout the book, Timmermann references across Kant's vast catalogue of writings and lectures, as well as across a wide variety of contemporary English- and German-language scholarship on Kant.

Timmermann's book is very sensitive to issues of Kant's use of the German language, and compares Kant's use of a particular term in both the Groundwork and other texts.  Timmermann often contrasts Kant's use of a term in the Groundwork with German synonyms that Kant uses in different contexts in his other writings.  A reader would get an impression of Timmermann's command of Kant's terminology and language well before getting to the important and helpful glossary at the end of the book, which goes into some detail.  Timmermann places some of his interpretations of the Groundwork at odds with those of other contemporary interpreters of Kant (such as those of Thomas E. Hill, which I will discuss later in the review), and gives arguments in his appendices that are short but powerful alternatives to many in contemporary Kant scholarship.

Timmermann's introduction gives a broad context for interpreting and understanding what he calls Kant's "modest" project in the Groundwork. (18)  He spends much of his introduction arguing against a standard interpretation of Kant that the Groundwork (by itself or with Kant's other works) presents a moral theory that can determine moral right and wrong.  Kant's formulations of the categorical imperative are sometimes taught as giving students a principle that can help the student determine right and wrong in a variety of situations.  Timmermann is careful to point out that Kant contradicts this claim.  He details Kant's view that the existence of morality already presupposes people know right from wrong, and philosophy can add little or nothing to this knowledge.  Kant sees himself as simply giving a new formula for a law we already know and can easily use at any time.  In the Groundwork, Timmermann says, Kant suggests that knowing moral right from wrong is simple; what is difficult is getting the philosophical foundations of morality right.  Thus, Kant's Groundwork does not give a moral principle (or formula of that principle) that tells us right and wrong (this is better done with untutored common human understanding than a formulation of the categorical imperative).  Rather, Timmermann points out that "The purpose of the Groundwork is a more modest one: Kant 'merely' seeks to identify and to firmly establish the highest principle of morality." (xii)  All moral agents already have access to the moral law, and already know right from wrong, so long as foreign and irrelevant considerations do not confuse moral judgment by introducing inclinations into the mix.  Timmermann says, "Kant is extremely confident about the cognitive and affective moral capacities of human beings, but he is also very skeptical about the actual moral quality of our conduct." (xiv)  We know right and wrong, but we do not will it consistently.

Kant's purpose for writing the Groundwork is not to tell us right and wrong, but to protect moral judgment from the influence of bad moral theory about the ultimate moral principle.  Timmermann makes a helpful analogy comparing native language use to common moral judgment, and linguistic theory to moral theory.  We do not need moral theory or linguistic theory to tell us right and wrong in their respective domains.  We can judge properly without a theory in both the case of language use and of morals.  However, a bad linguistic theory about the ultimate nature of grammar, and a bad moral theory about the ultimate nature of morality, can corrupt language use and moral judgment.  One of the main aims of the Groundwork, according to Timmermann, is to give a good moral theory that will leave the common understanding of morals that we already have uncorrupted.

Kant restricts the Groundwork to elucidating a universal principle that we already use in our practical reasoning that is purified of any inclinations (moral principles should not serve mere human desire).  Timmermann points out that Kant's Groundwork is about what makes our amazing moral ability to know and do right possible.  What makes it possible that we already know what is right is that it already is found in common human understanding.  Since we are morally obligated by the moral law, then we always have a moral motive that can overcome all contrary inclinations (ought implies can).  Timmermann tells us that the Groundwork shows what must obtain for such a motive to be possible, and what must obtain is freedom of the will.

Timmermann often bolsters his interpretation by referring to Kant's other works.  His commentary is very useful if one wants to find where Kant talks about similar issues in his other writings.  For example, he refers to Kant's Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone to show how confident Kant was in common human moral judgment, when Kant says that conscientious moral judgment cannot err, and is a "guiding thread" in matters of doubt. (xvii)  Timmermann's (somewhat controversial) interpretation is that, according to Kant, an agent should not do anything that the agent is not certain is right (this is the mistake the inquisitor makes).  This "principle of certainty" is not expressed in the Groundwork, but Timmermann's account of it gives the reader a useful perspective on what Kant says in the Groundwork about the power of common human understanding.

Let me give a few other examples of Timmermann's interpretations that conflict with some other commentators.  Timmermann mentions a few instances where he disagrees with the interpretations of the widely read Kant scholar Thomas E. Hill.  I will mention two such conflicts.

Kant famously does not explicitly name the first proposition of ordinary morality.  Professor Hill and others, including myself, have traditionally given the first proposition as something like: "An action has moral worth if and only if it is done from duty, and not merely in accord with duty."  Timmermann, argues that the first proposition is rather: "An action that coincides with duty has moral worth if and only if its maxim produces it by necessity, even without or contrary to inclination." (26)  Timmermann's argument for his interpretation has two parts.

First, he argues that it accounts for Kant's suggestion that the third proposition is a consequence of the first and second propositions.  This seems to be a reasonable principle of charity for Kant's first proposition to be consistent with what he says about how the third proposition follows from it and the second proposition.

Second, Timmermann argues that his interpretation of the first proposition is encapsulated in the famous examples that Kant gives in this section of the Groundwork.  The examples of the "coldhearted benefactor" and the "man of hopeless sorrow," for instance, illustrate maxims which express the inevitable commitment to acting from duty even though the agent either lacks the requisite inclination or has strong contrary inclinations.  I must admit that I had been a follower of Hill's interpretation, but I found Timmermann's arguments quite compelling for this interpretation of the first proposition.

Another example of Timmermann's disagreeing with Professor Hill is in his commentary on the hypothetical imperative.  Timmermann says

this imperative does not command either to take the means or to give up the end.  A hypothetical imperative in general commands nothing … it is not the purpose of a hypothetical or any other kind of imperative to 'leave us options'.  (70)  

This "option interpretation" is Professor Hill's interpretation.  Timmermann goes on to say "rather, [the hypothetical imperative] commands [one] to take the means when the end in question is to be realized." (70)  So, rather than interpreting the hypothetical imperative as giving us a choice between either accepting the end or rejecting the means, the hypothetical imperative merely commands us to take the means when the end in question is accepted.

This reviewer found the appendices to be especially enjoyable gems at the end of the book. They include: "Schiller's scruples of conscience," "The pervasiveness of morality," "Universal legislation, ends and puzzle maxims," "Indirect duty: Kantian consequentialism," "Freedom and moral failure: Reinhold and Sidgwick," and "The project of a 'metaphysics of morals'."  Each appendix is a focused piece of Kant scholarship, tightly argued in two or three pages, that gives important insights into recent or ongoing academic debates concerning Kant's Groundwork. Take, for example, Timmermann's appendix "Universal legislation, ends and puzzle maxims."  In it, he argues that puzzle maxims seem unable to be universalized with counterintuitive consequences for Kant's theory:

A maxim along the lines of "I want to dine at a friend's place at 7:00 pm on Mondays" cannot be universalized if we assume that the particular friend in question must be present, for example to discharge his or her responsibilities as the host of the party.  But, surely, there is nothing wrong with dining at a friend's place on Monday nights?  We have all done it.  Our conscience was silent.  Yet the universalization test of the categorical imperative would seem to rule it out. (157)

Timmermann points out that many philosophers solve this puzzle by arguing that somehow this maxim is illegitimate as a maxim, and should not count as a maxim according to Kant's theory.  Some of them say this maxim is too specific in its form, and that maxims should be general "life rules" rather than specific intentions about going to specific kinds of places at specific times of day.  Timmermann is not very happy with this solution, in part because he thinks that Kant often uses examples of maxims that would not count as general life rules:

For instance, should the suicide's maxim, to shorten his life 'when its longer duration is likely to bring more pain and satisfaction,' count as a 'life rule'?  It is not by definition that maxims as such are general but a good maxim is, precisely because it can be universalized. (157)

So Timmermann argues that this "dining at 7:00 pm at a friend's place" maxim is indeed a legitimate maxim as such but not a morally legitimate maxim.  After all, anyone who is committed to showing up at your house at 7:00 pm every Monday, come hell or high water, is not someone who respects other people very much. (158)

In conclusion, Timmermann's paragraph by paragraph commentary, introduction, synopsis of the argument, six short interpretive essays, and glossary do indeed constitute an indispensable resource for anyone wishing to study Kant's ethical theory in detail.  These parts of the book together give the broad context for interpreting Kant's Groundwork as a whole, as well as the details for understanding particular passages in sections.  Timmermann's book is an important resource for almost any student or faculty member who wants a deeper understanding of Kant's Groundwork for either teaching or research.