Kant's Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim: A Critical Guide

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Amelie Oksenberg Rorty and James Schmidt (eds.), Kant's Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim: A Critical Guide, Cambridge UP, 2009, 257pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521874632.

Reviewed by Michael Allen, East Tennessee State University



This latest contribution to the Cambridge Critical Guides series consists of a new translation of Kant’s Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim by Allen Wood, along with a total of twelve critical essays by leading Kant scholars. The editors, Amelie Oksenberg Rorty and James Schmidt, have arranged the critical essays to address sequentially each of the propositions offered by Kant in the Idea. The result is an extraordinarily thorough examination of these rather sketchy propositions. Indeed, the essays examine in considerable depth the interrelationships of the propositions with one another, as well as their bearing upon related ideas in the history of philosophy, ranging from natural purposiveness and sociability to providence and the emergence of the cosmopolitan political order. All of the essays are of a high quality, and serve the intended purpose of guiding the reader through an often neglected text of Kant. The careful reader gains a strong appreciation for the importance of the Idea, especially in comparison with Kant’s subsequent essay on Perpetual Peace, which has been much more widely anthologized and commented upon.1

In what follows, I first address some of the resources from the history of philosophy upon which Kant draws in developing his telos of history in an enlightened cosmopolitan condition. I then focus on Kant’s appeal to social antagonism as the motive force of moral and institutional progress. Finally, I consider what is unique about the cosmopolitanism developed in the Idea as opposed to Perpetual Peace. While I cannot possibly do justice to the range and diversity of the contributions made in this collection of critical essays, I hope to motivate interest in the efforts of the contributors to reexamine the Idea, as a text of enduring philosophical importance.

Historical Resources

I focus my remarks here on resources Kant draws from classical political philosophy and the philosophy of the late middle ages. Most of the contributors to this collection are more concerned with elucidating what Kant takes from classical political philosophy and developments in early modern philosophy, such that pre-modern resources are somewhat neglected by comparison. To be sure, several contributors, along with Rorty and Schmidt themselves, identify the importance to Kant of the Stoic view that nature does nothing in vain. Indeed, far from being accidental, regularities display a functional organization or telos in which each part plays an essential role (1-2). Moreover, it is human rationality that constitutes human freedom, which ultimately finds its highest expression in political cosmopolitanism, as the Stoic sage detaches himself from his peculiar social situation to discover by his own intelligence the moral principles embodied in nature itself. Comparisons with Stoicism, however, also belie important differences in Kant’s own unique appeal to teleology that are well worth pointing out, for they help to reveal the very different direction of cosmopolitan thought taken by Kant.

By contrast with Stoicism, Kant stresses that freedom and the moral point of view are to be seen as the outcome of a struggle of human beings to resolve problems arising from their very situatedness both locally and globally. Here the conventional — or the normative — is the subject not of the wise detachment of the Stoic sage, but of a progressive evolution through social struggle. Indeed, understood in terms of his peculiar epistemological concerns, Kant’s telos of history points not to growth in the wisdom of detached individuals but growth in the rational potentials of the entire species. This latter conception of a species-wide moral developmental growth is most clearly articulated in the philosophy of the late middle ages, and particularly Dante’s Monarchy,2 an historical precursor to Kant’s Idea that surprisingly escapes the attention of any of the contributors to this new volume. Adapting Stoic cosmopolitanism to Christianity, Dante fitted the idea of just such a development into an Aristotelian system.

Here Dante argued that, considered as a whole, humankind has its own function or purpose, which cannot be fulfilled by any individual, or, for that matter, any particular group or race. This purpose is to realize human intellectual potential all at once and all the time, and not simply by the detached Stoic sage. Moreover, it is only world peace that enables human beings to realize their potential both fully and continuously. The production of human culture is indeed a collective effort of all humanity unimpeded by warfare and strife. Such a conception of development in the species but not in the individual, based on the presupposition of world peace, is substantively that appropriated by Kant in the Idea. Contrary to Dante’s Christian Aristotelianism, however, Kant argues against monarchy and in favor of a federation of states and the ideal of cosmopolitan public law. Once more, the difference may be attributed to Kant’s peculiar concern with the progressive evolution of norms through social struggle.

Unsocial Sociability

Indeed, this shift from development of the potentials of the species not through world monarchy but federation may be attributed to Kant’s embrace of a distinctly modern conception of sociality in terms of a tension between social and unsociable character traits. For Kant, human beings are not inherently political animals in the Aristotelian sense, but are rather torn between the desire not to live an entirely solitary life and the desire to have everything go the way they want it to go. This inevitably pits each against the others as mutual antagonists in a struggle for possessions and honors, antagonists who simply cannot do without one another. Nonetheless, far from being an unfortunate condition of humanity, Kant contends that it is precisely this unsocial sociability that functions as a spur to the cultivation of the potentials of the species.

Here several contributors to this new volume, in particular J. B. Schneewind, do an outstanding job locating Kant’s unsocial sociability thesis within the context of Enlightenment debates on sociality, including natural law theorists, such as Grotius, Pufendorf, Burlmanqui, and Hobbes. In the context of these debates, Kant departs from the latter thinkers in that he makes no attempt to derive moral laws, or laws of nations, from the desire, or imperative, of sociability, or the nature of individuals (104). Instead, as Pauline Kleingeld rightly notes, his emphasis falls on the disciplinary function of public law, as itself a necessary condition of freedom among unsocially sociable beings, whose relations remain necessarily fraught and antagonistic (172). Here the need for the crucial disciplinary function of law is clarified best by Allen Wood, when he stresses the tension between Kant’s formulation of universal moral law, in the Groundwork, and the propensity to seek superiority over others by making exceptions for oneself (121).

Indeed, given this irreducible tension in social relations, human beings cannot develop the self-discipline that is necessary for moral agency without public law, and its ever present threat of sanctions. Kant’s practical presupposition of freedom is thus tied to public law in the just state that grants its subjects freedom while also determining and constraining this same freedom. That is, it is tied to such law in the sense that the latter effectively coordinates social struggle and antagonism so as to enable natural competitors peacefully to pursue diverse projects and try to outdo one another. As stimulated by unsocial sociability, the evolution of public law in the just state facilitates a general growth in the cultural potentials of the species,3 regardless of the specific intentions of individual human beings as competitors and mutual antagonists. In this respect, Kant also appropriates the insights of thinkers like Mandeville and Smith into the unintended consequences of intentional action.

The unintended consequences of unsocial sociability as facilitated by the disciplinary function of public law, however, are not alone sufficient to complete the telos of history in the fulfillment of human potentials. This is in part due to Kant’s insistence on the impossibility of producing a state that is perfectly just, given the irreducible tendency in human nature to antagonism and conflict. It is also due to the reproduction of such vexed competition as may be found within the state between individuals in the international domain, as states themselves compete with one another for superior possessions and prestige. The peace that may be established within the state through the disciplining of mutually antagonistic individuals is thus constantly imperiled by international conflict and warfare. This in turn points to the need for the disciplining of states in essentially the interest of learning an international morality through which the diverse forms of human culture may flourish globally. Such an international morality entails a further evolution of norms through the mutual antagonism of states to the cosmopolitan condition of a federation of states, possessing real legislative, juridical, and legislative powers at the federal level.

The Cosmopolitan Condition in the Idea

Here the truly unique feature of Kant’s treatment of the cosmopolitan condition in the Idea becomes fully apparent. The strong claim for the federation of states stands in marked contrast to the weaker cosmopolitan argument later offered by Kant in Perpetual Peace for a purely voluntary league of nations, lacking any binding universal jurisdiction over all states that admits no derogation. That is, the cosmopolitanism of the Idea is unique in that Kant’s argument for universal jurisdiction is tied into his peculiar conception of the teleology of history as detached from the idea of deriving universal moral laws from the natural law, whether in its ancient Stoic or early modern manifestations in Grotius and Pufendorf, and so on. As an argument for binding universal jurisdiction as the precondition of global peace and the development of human potentials, however, the Idea‘s cosmopolitanism is certainly not altogether unique. For, as already noted in the first section, such cosmopolitanism predates Kant, in many key respects, in Dante’s Christian Aristotelianism.

What, though, distinguishes Dante’s strong appeal to universal jurisdiction in Monarchy from Kant’s appeal to the same in the Idea? The simplest answer to this question is, of course, that the difference is that between the appeal to world monarchy over world federation. Nevertheless Dante’s monarch actually performs a remarkably similar function to Kant’s federation insofar as its aim is also the protection of security and rights of states, even the smallest, in accordance with the laws of a united power. This undoubtedly stills leaves important differences in the design of monarchical and federal institutions, Kant apparently substituting for Dante’s world monarch a permanent senate along the lines proposed by Abbe de St. Pierre (17, 178). Indeed, he also detaches the crucial peace-making task of arbitrating international disputes from the person of such a monarch, assigning it instead to an international court of arbitration.

The more substantive difference, however, concerns the alternate conceptions of Dante and Kant not of the purpose of history — both regarding this as the realization of human potentials — but the motive force of the movement towards this realization. Dante, for his part, attributes this to a form of secular political leadership concentrated in the authority of one who is inured from the possibility of political corruption, precisely in virtue of his unlimited jurisdictional power. World peace thus becomes a function of the wisdom of the monarch who legislates and arbitrates in the public good, having no further need to seek superiority of prestige or position. Inured from the possibility of corruption, the virtue and wisdom of the world monarch is sufficient to warrant the quite extraordinarily optimistic claim that the purpose of history in the fulfillment of diverse human potentials can be realized all at once and all the time.

For Kant, by contrast, the motive force of the movement towards the end of history in the fulfillment of human potentials is not virtuous leadership, inured from the possibility of corruption, but rather the unsociable characteristics of humanity. Here the universal jurisdiction of the permanent world senate and world court of adjudication is tied explicitly to the irreducible antagonism consequent on unsocial sociability. Indeed, world federal institutions are the evolutionary outgrowth of international antagonism, facilitating a movement from such antagonism to world peace and the possibility of human fulfillment, in spite of the limits of human virtue and wisdom. Such institutions certainly do not guarantee the fulfillment of human potentials all at once and all the time in the context of monarchy as opposed to federation, but at the most hold open the possibility of a growth in the potentials of the species that is never fully realized.

This very pessimism about the prospects for the full realization of human potentials — and especially human potentials for moral learning — produces the difficulty for Kant that has led to the frequent dismissal of the Idea as the immature and underdeveloped forerunner to Perpetual Peace. As Kleingeld notes, Kant never addressed in the Idea the problem that a world federation might itself produce injustices, given that unsocial sociability forecloses the possibility of there being any perfectly just states (179). Indeed, in Perpetual Peace, Kant retracts the notion of a universal jurisdiction with coercive powers in favor of a voluntary league of nations lacking such powers, on the ground that it would be unjust for a despotically ruled federation to incorporate an unwilling republic by military means. In Kleingeld’s estimation, this retraction is not, however, complete in that Kant saw the voluntary league as an intermediate step between the international state of nature and the full cosmopolitan condition, as defended in the Idea (182).

Nonetheless, it is striking that the argument for a purely voluntary league, as designed to avert the objection of a despotical world federation, also entails abandoning the core argument from the Idea of the disciplinary function of public law in facilitating a process of moral learning among states. Indeed, given the line of argument developed in the Idea, it is hard to see how a voluntary league could function as an intermediary step towards the cosmopolitan condition, lacking the coercive power to facilitate any such learning process through the imposition of sanctions on unsocially sociable states. Here the failure of the early twentieth century experiment with such a league, and the development in the late twentieth and early twenty-first century of ever thickening webs of international human rights law, might well be taken to suggest the greater prescience of Kant’s earlier emphasis on the disciplinary benefits of a more strenuous cosmopolitan condition.

In this light, the key weakness of the Idea might be said to be Kant’s failure to provide a functional equivalent to the kind of argument offered by Dante for the immunity of universal jurisdiction to injustice. To be sure, Dante’s idea that the unbounded jurisdiction of the world monarch should provide a guarantee against the monarch’s corruption is especially discordant to modern ears, accustomed to the idea that unbounded, or absolute, power corrupts absolutely. But modern republican constitutional rule is designed specifically to act as a check on corruption by separating powers within the larger federal framework, such that the vice of one acts as a check on the vice of another, and providing legally protected opportunities for public criticism.4 Here the constitutional separation or dispersal of powers is held to be consistent with the juridical arbitration in a final, or supreme, court of appeal according to the fundamental rights and freedoms of all persons.

Rather than arguing for a voluntary league as an intermediate step towards the cosmopolitan condition, Kant could have developed the arguments for the disciplinary benefits of cosmopolitan law by attending much more closely to the question of the appropriate distribution and balancing of powers in constitutional design grounded in fundamental rights. This, after all, is the direction taken by contemporary advocates of the cosmopolitan condition, such as David Held, who argue for a complex system of multileveled governance within the overarching framework of human rights law.5 Indeed, in the context of such law, the approach of the contemporary advocates of cosmopolitanism like Held might well be said to preserve Kant’s original stress on universal jurisdiction and the disciplinary effects of law across state borders, albeit on a more disaggregated and distributed arrangement of lower jurisdictions.6 Here the more robust cosmopolitanism of the Idea emerges as one of greater relevance to contemporary cosmopolitanism debates than the weakened cosmopolitanism of Perpetual Peace. This alone surely warrants taking seriously the present reexamination of the Idea, as a text that continues to have a direct bearing on the prospects for the ongoing evolution of cosmopolitan norms.

1 See, for instance, Kant’s “To Eternal Peace” in Basic Writings of Kant, ed. Allen W. Wood (New York: The Modern Library Classics, 2001).

2 See Dante Alighieri, Monarchy, ed. Prue Shaw (Cambridge UK: Cambridge UP, 2008).

3 For an excellent discussion of Kant’s notion of ‘cultural agency’ in the multi-cultural context of his Enlightenment anti-imperialism, see Sankar Muthu’s Enlightenment Against Empire (Princeton NJ: Princeton UP, 2003).

4 For Kant’s discussion of the role of public criticism, see his “Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” in Basic Writings of Kant.

5 See David Held’s Democracy and the Global Order: From Modern State to Cosmopolitan Governance (Cambridge UK: Polity Press, 1995).

6 Also see Held’s Global Covenant: The Social Democratic Alternative to the Washington Consensus (Cambridge UK: Polity Press, 2004), Ch. 4.