Kant's Search for the Supreme Principle of Morality

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Kerstein, Samuel J., Kant's Search for the Supreme Principle of Morality, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 240pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521810892.

Reviewed by Christopher Gowans, Fordham University


In this clearly-written and carefully-argued volume, Samuel J. Kerstein offers a qualified defense of Kant’s claim to have established, in the first two sections of the Groundwork, that, “if there is a supreme principle of morality, then it is the Categorical Imperative” (p. 1). Kerstein calls this conditional assertion a “derivation” of the Categorical Imperative (hereafter, CI), in contrast to the proof or “deduction” of the CI that Kant attempted in the third section of the Groundwork and seemed to regard as impossible and unnecessary in the Critique of Practical Reason (see 47). (All references to Kant employ the standard Prussian Academy pagination). It is often supposed that Kant’s derivation contains a serious gap, both in the first section of the Groundwork (at 402) and in the second section (at 420-21). For example, in Bruce Aune’s account, Kant maintains without argument that the Formula of Universal Law version of the CI follows from the principle “Conform your actions to universal law” (Kant’s Theory of Morals, Princeton University Press, 1979, pp. 28ff.) In opposition to this interpretation, Kerstein defends a “criterial reading” of Kant. In this view, Kant first “develops criteria that any viable candidate for the supreme principle of morality must fulfill” (p. 12), and he then argues that the Formula of Universal Law version meets these criteria, while any rival principle does not. Kerstein believes Kant’s text “permits the criterial reading” (p. 12), and he thinks that, if we substitute the Formula of Humanity version of the CI for the Formula of Universal Law, Kant’s position is quite promising, though not without problems.

In three preliminary chapters, Kerstein interprets Kant’s theory of agency (his understanding of maxims, grounds of the will, and acting from inclination), and he criticizes two attempts to fill the aforementioned gap in Kant’s derivation: Henry E. Allison’s construction of a derivation Kant could have accepted, based on the second Critique (in the third part of Kant’s Theory of Freedom (Cambridge University Press, 1990) and elsewhere), and Christine M. Korsgaard’s reconstruction of a derivation of the Formula of Humanity version of the CI (especially in Ch. 4 of Creating the Kingdom of Ends (Cambridge University Press, 1996)). Kerstein maintains that Allison has not established that transcendentally free rational agents must justify their maxims only on the basis of the Formula of Universal Law; other principles, such as “Act only on that maxim that you cannot, at the same time, will that it become a universal law,” have not been excluded (p. 45). Against Korsgaard, he argues that she has shown neither that a supreme principle of morality requires something unconditionally good nor that this good is humanity.

At the center of Kerstein’s positive argument is the contention that, for Kant, there are eight criteria for being the supreme principle of morality. The first four are said to follow from the “basic concept” of this principle assumed by commonsense morality and implicitly stated in the Preface to the Groundwork. The supreme principle must be:

(1) Practical
(2) Absolutely necessary
(3) Binding on all rational agents
(4) The supreme norm for the moral evaluation of action.

(1) means that agents can deliberate and act on the principle. (2) says that the principle is “an unconditional command” that obligates us irrespective of what we want to do. (3) states that the principle binds not only human beings but “all rational agents, at all times and places” (p. 2). And (4) means that the principle distinguishes permissible, impermissible, and required actions as well as determining the moral goodness of actions. The remaining four criteria are more controversial and more central to Kant’s derivation on Kerstein’s interpretation. The supreme principle must be such that:

(5) All and only actions conforming to this principle because the principle requires it—that is, all and only actions done from duty—have moral worth;
(6) The moral worth of (any case of) conforming to this principle from duty stems from its motive, not from its effects;
(7) An agent’s representing this principle as a law—that is, a universally and unconditionally binding principle—gives the agent sufficient incentive to conform to it; and
(8) A plausible set of duties (assumed by ordinary rational knowledge of morals) can be derived from this principle.

(These formulations of the last four criteria follow, but renumber, the summary on p. 112.) Kerstein devotes comparatively little space to (1) through (4). But he expends considerable effort defending the interpretation of Kant as accepting (5) through (8) as criteria for the supreme moral principle (relying on passages from the Groundwork and other texts, especially the second Critique). Moreover, with one important exception (discussed below), he mostly defends the philosophical plausibility of these criteria.

With these conclusions as a foundation, Kerstein argues that the eight criteria (properly qualified) eliminate several prominent rivals to the CI: utilitarianism, perfectionism, a principle incorporating some of the Ten Commandments, and others. He rejects Kant’s attempts to give a general argument against any such rivals on the ground that these principles must be “material” (or “heteronymous”). In Kerstein’s view, they need not be material. Moreover, he does not attribute his specific arguments against the rivals to Kant. His point is that the arguments are plausible and are available to Kant on the basis of the criteria.

Finally, Kerstein evaluates Kant’s central claim, on his interpretation, that the eight criteria support the CI. He rejects Kant’s contention that the criteria support the Formula of Universal Law version of the CI, mainly on the common ground that this formula fails to meet criterion (8): “despite some ingenious efforts, no one has been able to make this formula work” (p. 174). On the other hand, he argues that a promising, though not yet conclusive, case can be made that the eight criteria support the Formula of Humanity version of the CI. Kerstein’s primary conclusion is that the assertion that a supreme moral principle would have to be the Formula of Humanity is a philosophically viable position worthy of our consideration.

Kerstein has reflected seriously and carefully on these central issues in Kant’s moral philosophy. He obviously does not defend the letter of Kant, but he appears deeply committed to the spirit. His modifications are not insubstantial, but they are usually the result of trying to develop a coherent position that is rooted in Kant’s most basic convictions. His book raises numerous important questions. I will comment on four of these here.

First, Kerstein’s argument makes considerable use of (8), but I do not find it as obvious as he does that Kant accepted (8) as a criterion for being the supreme principle. Kant’s discussion of the four examples in Section II of the Groundwork lends support to Kerstein’s contention, and in defense he cites passages that precede the two considerations of these examples (at 421 and 429). But these passages do not explicitly say that (8) is a criterion. Kant clearly thinks that we can derive our duties (whatever these are) from the supreme principle (whatever this is): This much is already stated in (4). Moreover, he thinks that what he takes to be our duties can be derived from what he takes to be the supreme principle, namely the CI; and he thinks that this is what everyone ordinarily does (see 402). However, it does not follow that he accepts (8) as a criterion for the derivation of the supreme principle, a criterion that should be employed to include or exclude candidates for the principle. This would make antecedent knowledge of our duties premises for the derivation. Near the beginning of Section II, Kant says, “Nor could one give worse advice to morality than by wanting to derive it from examples.” And he adds, “examples serve only for encouragement” (408-9 in Mary J. Gregor’s translation in the Cambridge edition). His point, oft repeated, is that we must first know the supreme principle on . priori grounds and then derive duties from it, not the other way around. Kerstein acknowledges this with respect to the deduction of the principle in Section III, but this forces him to say, “the deduction of the Formula of Universal Law does not presuppose the success of its derivation” (p. 91). This appears to make the first two sections unnecessary to the third, an interpretation that is hard to accept. The derivation would seem to have little point if we can prove the CI without it.

This relates to a second issue. In Kant’s view, the Formula of Universal Law concerns the form of the CI, the Formula of Humanity concerns the matter, and the two are united in a third formula that involves the ideas of autonomy and the kingdom of ends. Kant says the three formulae are subjectively different, but objectively the same (see 436). Nonetheless, in the deduction of the CI, Kant primarily focuses on the form and has little to say explicitly about the matter. This raises a question about Kerstein’s interpretation. He does not think the first two formulae are equivalent (the third is not discussed), and he believes Kant’s derivation does not establish the Universal Law formulation, but could well establish the Humanity formula. It would seem to follow that Kant’s deduction of the CI is largely irrelevant to what Kerstein finds philosophically significant in the first two sections of the Groundwork. Of course, this may well be correct: The third section is notoriously difficult to interpret in any case. Nonetheless, by bracketing the issue of the deduction of the CI, as Kerstein effectively does, he leaves it unclear how the derivation of the CI relates, or should relate, to Kant’s overall moral philosophy.

Third, Kerstein challenges the philosophical plausibility of part of criterion (5). In his view, “some actions contrary to duty can actually be done from duty and thereby have moral worth” (p. 119). Two examples are proposed. First, a “morally reflective person” accepts the CI, and in a difficult situation concludes “after careful thought” that it would justify suicide (pp. 121-2). Second, a person concludes, “after years of long, careful, and strenuous reflection” that Act Utilitarianism is correct, and infers from this that lying is justified in a particular case (p. 123). If Kant is right, since suicide and lying are contrary to duty, these actions have no moral worth. According to Kerstein, the fact that they result from conscientious reflection may be enough to give them moral worth even if they are contrary to duty. His argument is in part polemical: since Kant allows that bad effects beyond our control cannot undermine moral worth when we have acted from duty, reasoning to a mistaken conclusion, when this is beyond our control, should not undermine moral worth either. His main point is that a person’s action may have moral worth, even if the action is wrong, as long as the following four conditions are fulfilled: the person’s incentive must be rooted in a belief that her moral principle requires the action; the person’s belief that the action is morally required must be sufficient incentive to do it; she must do the best she can to achieve the goal of her action; and she “must make a genuine effort to determine what her duty is” (p. 130).

Kerstein acknowledges that it is possible that an “odious action” of a Nazi would have moral worth by this criterion, but he is prepared to accept this “painful” implication (p. 130). In addition, it seems that he would have to grant that the Nazi’s action would have more moral worth than the action of a person who does the right thing on the basis of inclination rather than duty—for example, someone who gives to charity solely on the basis of a sympathetic temperament. This is an unfortunate conclusion that it would be best to avoid. Assuming we share Kerstein’s intuitions about the two examples above, one approach would be to supplement his four conditions with a fifth; for example, the person’s moral outlook must not deviate too far from the correct moral principle. This is vague, but it might be made more specific. Another approach would be to say that there are two distinct dimensions of moral worth. Objective moral worth means that a person does what is in accord with the correct moral principle. Subjective moral worth means that Kerstein’s four conditions obtain. Either form of moral worth is possible without the other; in these cases, we say that there is moral worth in a certain respect. However, since both are important to us (though perhaps for different reasons), we suppose that full moral worth requires both. Kant thought that subjective moral worth is what really matters, and he was inclined to think it guarantees objective moral worth. Hence, he was not concerned about cases where the two diverge (but see a passage cited by Kerstein at Metaphysics of Morals 401 that suggests some concern). However, if we are concerned about these cases, it might be better to distinguish the two dimensions of moral worth and insist that both are important rather than to accept Kerstein’s counter-intuitive position.

Finally, Kerstein argues rather briefly that the Formula of Humanity is consistent with criteria (1) through (4). But suppose this formula sometimes had the result that two actions are morally required when it is not possible to perform both. It would then be doubtful that the formula would be consistent with criterion (1): This states that we can act on the principle. From the common assumption (arguably implicitly accepted by Kant) that, if A is required and B is required, then both A and B are required, it follows from conflicting requirements that we are required to do something we cannot do—contrary to (1). Hence, Kerstein needs to show that the Formula of Humanity cannot require conflicting actions. Kant, of course, is explicit that, though “two grounds of obligation” may conflict, “a collision of duties and obligations is inconceivable” (Metaphysics of Morals, 224). This shows that he accepts the constraint against conflicting duties. But it does not show that the Formula of Humanity cannot produce them, and it might be argued that it can. Suppose I can save the life of an innocent child only by stealing a car from someone. Theft is coercion and Kant is clear that respecting persons as ends precludes coercion. But does not respecting persons as ends in themselves also require saving the lives of innocent children? Respect for persons as ends appears to mean protecting and promoting rational nature. Kerstein needs to show that, in this circumstance, this principle either permits stealing the car or does not require saving the life of the child. He acknowledges that in an extreme case conflicting duties might be a problem (p. 183). However, a thorough discussion of the topic is needed to warrant the conclusion that only the Formula of Humanity could be the supreme moral principle

There is another approach to this issue. It might be argued that, contrary to Kant, conflicting duties are possible, and so we should reject criteria that preclude this. Kerstein’s discussion of the first four criteria is brief and he does not broach this issue. His Kantian position requires establishing both that there cannot be conflicting duties and that the Formula of Humanity cannot produce any. There is now a modest literature on the subject of moral dilemmas in Kant, and it is directly relevant to Kerstein’s topic. It is surprising that he does not discuss it.

In spite of these critical remarks, I strongly recommend Kerstein’s book to any one interested in Kant’s moral philosophy. It is a valuable contribution both in its overall argument and in its specific discussions.