Kant's Theory of Action

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Richard McCarty, Kant's Theory of Action, Oxford UP, 2009, 250pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199567720.

Reviewed by Patrick Frierson, Whitman College


Kant has two theories of action. One is empirical, a determinist account of actions in terms of the psychological causes that bring those actions about. The broad structure of this account will not seem particularly surprising nor particularly Kantian: certain kinds of beliefs and desires cause human beings to act in certain ways, and consistent patterns of belief, desire, and action in a person are ascribed to the “character” of that person. While McCarty develops a Leibnizian-Wolffian rather than Humean version of Kant’s empirical psychology, its general structure is consistent with most naturalist theories of action. Moreover, while some Kant scholars deny that Kant has any such determinist psychological theory, most Kantians admit there must be some sort of causal theory of observable actions, but haven’t bothered to figure out what it is. McCarty does a valuable service in starting discussion of Kant’s empirical account of action. And while later in this review, I raise objections to some of his claims, his discussions of such topics as maxims (chapter 1), incentives (chapter 2), and respect for the moral law (chapter 6) are discussions that Kant scholars — to whom this book is directed1 — should consult when they find themselves thinking about these topics.

Kant is most famous, however, not for his empirical account but for his other theory of action, the one associated with human freedom, and this account has traditionally been both more philosophically important and more contentious than the understudied and underappreciated empirical theory of action to which McCarty brings our attention. At present, the dominant approach to Kant’s non-determinist theory of action sees this theory as describing action from a particular “standpoint,” the first-person standpoint from which one deliberates about or (morally) evaluates actions. McCarty objects to this “two standpoint” approach and returns to a more traditional way of making sense of how Kant reconciles determinist psychology with freedom by distinguishing two “worlds”: through free action in the noumenal world “we have … chosen the characters we now portray in this grand theatre of the empirical world” (xxiii). For most Kant scholars, this articulation and defense of what has become known as a “two-world” interpretation of Kant’s transcendental idealism will be the most philosophically important — but also, alas, disappointing aspect of McCarty's book. 

One of McCarty’s central arguments against two-standpoint interpretations of Kant, and one of the guiding threads in his book as a whole, is what he calls “the problem of justification and explanation” (91). One way to put the problem is that Kant’s theory of action must both explain actions and show how they can be justified:

I think Kant’s view is that practical reasoning both justifies and explains action. It seems to me that most writers on Kant’s practical philosophy are convinced of this also. But I do not find among them a satisfactory explanation of how practical reasoning can do both. (1)

Here “explanation” is something like causal, psychological explanation, while “justification” is what is typically considered a first-person, reason-based account for why a particular course of action is worthy of choice. And I think that McCarty is right that most Kantians think that Kant should be able to both explain and justify action. But McCarty further articulates what I would call a “strong” problem of justification and explanation, one that most Kantians do not think that Kant needs to do, the task of “showing how the practical reasoning that justifies action can also explain it” (87). That is, McCarty wants the very same account of practical reasoning that is used to explain action to also be the account that justifies it, since, he claims, “what justifies action should be capable of explaining it; otherwise, justification is irrelevant” (27).2

McCarty’s book traces the problem of justification and explanation through a discussion of Kant’s two theories of action, starting in chapters 1 and 2 with his empirical psychology, moving in chapters 3-5 into his (two-world) theory of freedom, and ending with a couple of chapters directed towards applications of the theory laid out in the book.

In chapters 1 and 2, McCarty lays out Kant’s empirically-determinist theory of action. Chapter 1 focuses on the role of maxims, which McCarty sees as the major premises of practical syllogisms that result in “motives” for action. Every maxim, for McCarty, has the form “X is good,” so that one might reason from “happiness is good” (a maxim) and “jumping off this bridge now will increase happiness” (a particular judgment) to “jumping off this bridge now is good” (a “motive” to jump off the bridge).3 Chapter 2 focuses on the role of incentives in action, which McCarty identifies in general as “the psychological force of a maxim” (33), but goes on to distinguish as either “subjective” or “objective.” Subjectively, an incentive is a “psychologically compelling motive force” (33); objectively, the incentive is the “target” of one’s motive. Thus “happiness” could be an “objective” incentive, while that which gives happiness the force to motivate one to jump off a bridge would be the “subjective” incentive that is incorporated into the maxim “happiness is good.”

By the end of these first two chapters, McCarty claims to have accomplished two important goals. First, he has laid out his general empirical account of action, where any action can be explained by the maxims that have the strongest incentives incorporated into them combined with the judgments by virtue of which those maxims give rise to motivationally efficacious motives to specific actions. Since “maxims are desires” (13), this gives Kant a familiar strongest-desire + belief model of action, but with the Wolffian twist that “desires” here should be understood as incentivized maxims. Second, and because of this Wolffian twist, McCarty claims to have solved the problem of justification and explanation because “maxims are principles of practical reasoning, by which actions are justified, and incentives incorporated into maxims have explanatory power for the actions their maxims justify” (60).

The next three chapters of the book develop McCarty’s two-world account of noumenal action. In chapter 3, McCarty uses the problem of justification and explanation to offer a sustained attack on what he (wrongly) takes to be the standard view of Kant, which denies psychological determinism in order to make room for transcendental freedom.4 McCarty barrages his opponents with various arguments here, but his main overall criticism is that explanation via freedom makes solving the (strong) problem of explanation and justification impossible. Chapter 4 lays out McCarty’s account of Kantian freedom, according to which freedom takes place in a noumenal world within which “actions [are] free,” and “everything we do here is an appearance of what we do there” (105). Chapter 5 criticizes two-standpoint interpretations of Kant’s transcendental idealism and defends his account against various objections to the notion of noumenal, timeless agency.

Finally, the last two chapters take up more specific topics in Kant’s theory of action, applying the general theory to moral motivation (in chapter 6) and human evil (in chapter 7). The conclusion briefly discusses our “grounds for hope” and includes Kantian metaphysical musings about the afterlife.

In the end, Kant’s Theory of Action does not succeed in providing two important and sorely needed contributions that it aims to provide for Kant scholarship today: a detailed account of Kant’s psychologically determinist theory of action and a spirited defense of a two world interpretation of Kant’s transcendental idealism. Before turning to some criticisms, I want to join McCarty in emphasizing the importance of both aims. Kant’s theory of action has long been discussed within writing on his moral philosophy, where the emphasis has been on how free practical agency gives Kant a conception of action much different than broadly empiricist belief-desire models dominant today. But this emphasis has obscured Kant’s empirical theory of action and weakened Kant’s relevance to contemporary debates about empirical psychology. And there is a need today to revisit debates about whether Kant’s view is best interpreted in terms of two standpoints rather than two metaphysically distinct “worlds,” but while there have been recent criticisms of two-standpoint approaches,5 McCarty’s is the first recent attempt to offer a sustained articulation and defense of a two-world view.

In terms of articulating Kant’s psychologically determinist account of action, McCarty’s presentation of his account is clear, consistent, and original, but incomplete and insufficiently defended. In itself, incompleteness is hardly an objection; one can cover only so much in a single monograph. But the account is incomplete in two crucial ways that undermine the extent to which it solves the problem of justification and explanation. For McCarty, actions are justified by practical syllogisms that move from maxims through judgments to motives that dictate the goodness of particular courses of action. And actions are explained by incentives that give maxims psychological force. But McCarty offers no account of the origin of one’s maxims or the basis for the incorporation of incentives into those maxims. McCarty might say that maxims and their relative strengths are just basic facts about one’s empirical character, explicable only in terms of one’s intelligible character.6 Or he might say that there is an empirical story to be told, perhaps a conjunction of genetics, education, and other circumstances, but that he simply did not push his explanations back that far. In either case, McCarty seems unable to solve the (strong) problem of justification and explanation. Either one’s actions are left ultimately unexplained (the first case) or the explanation is merely natural and not justificatory (the second case). (I would add that I think that Kant does give much more empirical detail here;7 yet because I don’t think Kant wants to solve the strong problem of justification and explanation, this isn’t a problem for Kant, though it is for McCarty.)

In addition to being insufficient in crucial respects, McCarty’s version of Kant’s empirical psychology, especially the role of maxims, is thinly defended. McCarty’s interpretation of maxims is based on assimilating Kant and Christian Wolff on the grounds that Kant neither criticized Wolff nor laid out his own alternative account, so “it … seems most likely that Kant assumed maxims were already well enough understood … through Wolff” (6). But many of Kant’s key differences with Wolff revolved precisely around Wolff’s conflation of desire with cognition (see e.g. Kant’s Lectures on Metaphysics, 28:261-2), so it would have been reasonable for Kant not to see desire - even higher desires — as cognitions of something “as good.” Moreover, the way McCarty describes maxims as being of the form “X is good” makes it difficult to see how the categorical imperative evaluates the form but not matter of maxims. For me, at least, seeing maxims as practical principles of the form “in situation S, do A for purpose P” makes this clearer.8 And there is as much historical basis for conceiving of maxims as general practical principles or rules of thumb as for reading them in a strictly Wolffian way.9

McCarty's second main task in the book is the defense of a two-world metaphysics, which involves attacking two-standpoint theories and articulating his positive theory. McCarty offers dozens of various attacks on two-standpoint theories, some of which strike me as important, but most of which seem to be deeply uncharitable and generally to miss the point of the views he is attacking. His most important argument -- that two-standpoint theories fail to solve the problem of justification and explanation -- is just beside the point. The "two standpoints" he's criticizing refer precisely to the two tasks of justification and explanation. Insofar as McCarty's problem is taken in its weak sense, two-standpoint theories might not give as much detail about the explanations of actions as McCarty does, but they provide a space for such detail and directly address action-justification. Insofar as the problem is taken in the strong sense, it is one that two-standpoint theories (rightly, in my view) do not think should be solved, since explanation and justification are precisely two different tasks, assigned to two different standpoints. Similarly, McCarty seems to deliberately misconstrue two-standpoint theories with respect to the possibility of causal explanations of action. He insists that two-standpoint theorists deny psychological determinism, even while admitting -- though only in a footnote -- that "I do not think that Korsgaard believes that her interpretation . . . rules out psychological determinism" (65n8). With respect to both Korsgaard (65n8) and O'Neill (63), McCarty takes the claim that we see actions as free and not psychologically determined when considering them from a practical perspective to imply a denial of psychological determinism in explanation. But of course, avoiding this implication is precisely what the two standpoints are supposed to do. And McCarty's complaint that the sense in which we are free is different than the sense in which we are determined (65n8, see too 144) applies to his own view, where our noumenal freedom is not empirically determined.

McCarty’s attacks on two standpoint theories suffer from having constructed those theories in the least charitable light. His two-world view, regretfully, risks inviting a similar lack of charity. Those already sympathetic to two-world accounts will find interesting stands on several metaphysical issues that can arise once one posits metaphysically distinct but interacting worlds. But precisely because of the degree of metaphysical musing in which McCarty indulges, his two-world approach to Kant’s transcendental idealism ends up seeming too much like the metaphysical morass that drives folks towards alternative approaches to transcendental idealism. For example, McCarty notes that if human free agents really exist in a noumenal world,10 then “all of the substances of an intelligible world … affect other substances existing in the world to which they belong by … ‘determining’ differences in their accidents” (113). Strictly speaking, the notion that one’s noumenal properties are determined not only by oneself but by actions of other (finite) noumenal agents is consistent with Kant’s insistence that actions not be determined by any prior natural causes. But the idea that my transcendental freedom is determined by and partly determines the noumenal choices of every other thing-in-itself is more like the freedom of a turnspit than I thought Kant would have gone in for. For another example, McCarty argues that, rather than a mere two-fold distinction between phenomenal and noumenal worlds, we need (at least) “three classes of substances or entities”: a phenomenal world of appearances, a noumenal world of things in themselves, and a metaphysically distinct sphere (a world?) in which to place God (119). Again, there’s nothing strictly inconsistent about saying that God does not exist in the noumenal/intelligible world, but it commits Kant to greater metaphysical extravagance than posited by most two-world theorists. Any two-world theory invites metaphysical speculations about precisely how that world interacts with the empirical world and about the nature and internal structure of that world. But McCarty is particularly comfortable making noumenal metaphysical claims, and his claims end up being less modest and more odd than strictly necessary. And that is unfortunate, since I think a less metaphysically extravagant version of two-world metaphysics would be a more effective initial interlocutor in (re)emerging debates about how to interpret Kant’s theory of freedom.

While many of McCarty’s metaphysical speculations about the noumenal world are, at least in my experience, pretty idiosyncratic, he exhibits one common tendency of two-world theories, a tendency that drives an unnecessarily sharp wedge between two-world and two-standpoint approaches to Kant. The tendency comes from what one might see as an inevitable illusion associated with talking about timeless causation, an illusion due to the fact that categories, though in principle applicable to things-in-themselves, are typically and illegitimately applied thereto in schematized ways. Thus when applying “causation” to relations between noumena and phenomena, one almost cannot help but speak about this causation in temporal terms. This causes much trouble, not least because McCarty, like many advocates of two-world readings of Kant, illegitimately tends to read noumenal action as having occurred in the past. Thus McCarty uses phrases like “we ”">have freely chosen the characters we now portray in the empirical world" (xxiii, my emphasis) or, in his important “allegory of the play,” that “all their causally determined choices made onstage will depend ultimately on their ”“>preliminary free choices made offstage” (153, my emphasis, see too pp. 74, 78, 116, 159 for other examples).

The impact of importing past-tense temporal language into descriptions of noumenal agency can be seen simply by changing the tense of the above quotations to the present: “we freely ”“>choose the characters we now portray in the empirical world” and “all causally determined choices made onstage depend ultimately on free choices made offstage.” Given that temporal categories do not strictly apply to relations between noumena and phenomena, there is no reason that these present-tense sentences should be seen as any less adequate ways of describing the relationship between the noumenal and phenomenal worlds than McCarty’s past-tense versions.11 But phrased in the present-tense, these sentences could also be endorsed by two-standpoint theorists, who would simply add to McCarty’s metaphysically loaded picture the important point that from within the “off-stage” standpoint of deliberation, when actually deciding what to do, we do not see ourselves as determined by pre-given influences, but as determined by a character that is — not merely was — up to us. So the practical standpoint is the noumenal standpoint, understood properly as timeless and thus ever-present.12

Understood in this way, what McCarty — along with careful two-standpoint theories — rightly emphasizes is something all too easy to forget. Noumenal choice — however metaphysically loaded one construes it — is not primarily choice of particular actions, but choice of how empirical incentives operative in a given moment express themselves in one’s actions. Freedom is freedom to choose character, and only derivatively freedom to choose particular actions. For helping to highlight that important point, and for taking some first steps in opening discussions of Kant’s empirical psychology, we owe Richard McCarty gratitude

1 Those looking for a Kantian contribution to contemporary action theory, or even to contemporary debates about such issues as moral internalism and externalism will not find much to work with in the present volume. While the issues McCarty discusses are relevant to those debates, he does not engage in any serious way with recent literature on those topics.

2 For an elegant response to claims of this sort, see Christine Korsgaard, Sources of Normativity, Cambridge UP, 1996, p. 96.

3 See pp. 7-8 in McCarty’s book for a more detailed version of this practical syllogism.

4 There is some irony in my criticizing McCarty on this score, since my own “Kant’s Empirical Account of Action” (Philosopher’s Imprint 5.7 (December 2005): 1-32) emphasized the need to clearly articulate this empirical account because of the resistance to such an account amongst contemporary Kantians. Nonetheless, I think the most widespread view among contemporary Kantians is that Kant does allow that there is an empirical, psychologically-determinist account of action, but that it is his account of action from a practical perspective that is more interesting and more worthy of study. There are, of course, notable exceptions to this view, some of whom are discussed in my article, but these exceptions do not include Korsgaard or Onora O’Neill, two who feature prominently in McCarty’s book.

5 See, for example, Dana Nelkin, “Two Standpoints and the Belief in Freedom,” The Journal of Philosophy 157 (2000): 564-576 and Eric Watkins, Kant and the Metaphysics of Causality, Cambridge UP, 2006, especially pp. 322-9.

6 McCarty’s claim that “we need not acknowledge any empirical causes of our characters” (162) might even seem to suggest this.

7 For specifics about this more elaborate Kantian account, see my “Kant’s Empirical Account of Action,” (Philosopher’s Imprint 5.7 (December 2005): 1-32) and Kant’s Questions: What is the Human Being? (Routledge: forthcoming).

8 For a clear and concise explanation of this, see Korsgaard’s Creating the Kingdom of Ends, Cambridge UP, 1996, p. 75 n. 58.

9 See, e.g., Manfred Kuehn, Kant: A Biography, Cambridge UP, 2001, pp. 145-8. Kuehn has his own views on the nature of maxims that differ from the account I’ve given here, but he offers historical and textual reasons for thinking that Kant need not have adopted a specifically Wolffian conception of maxims.

10 McCarty claims that a “world,” for Kant, is “a whole of substances, in which each part stands in interaction … with every other part” (110).

11 It is important, of course, to maintain that noumenal choice determines phenomenal choice and not vice versa, but this can be done in the present tense as easily as with the use of past tense. There may be some contexts in which the past tense seems more natural and more consistent with Kant. Kant’s discussion of the problem posed by radical evil — that since we have chosen to subordinate moral to non-moral incentives, we are stuck with that choice — seems to be a prime example. Even here, though, I think that Kant’s theory actually fits with present-tense language better than with past-tense language (even when he uses past-tense language). In particular, it is really because we do (now) choose to subordinate moral to non-moral incentives that we cannot now also choose to reverse that choice. And given our past evil actions, we cannot now choose to have a character that consistently chooses in accordance with the moral law. But we can, now, choose to have either a character that chooses badly and then gets worse and worse, or one that chooses badly and then stays the same, or one that chooses badly and then gets better. It’s up to us, now, to reframe our past evil as an evil from which we turn to good or as an evil in which we get permanently mired. We needn’t have noumenally chosen to repent of our evil. Instead, we can - still noumenally - choose now to repent. And then we’ll be assigned to the character that repents, rather than to the one that doesn’t. For more discussion of this point, see my Freedom and Anthropology in Kant’s Moral Philosophy, especially chapter five.

12 O’Neill, in articulating this in the context of her two-standpoint approach to the relationship between explanation and (first-personal) justification, puts the point well:

The important limitation is that all naturalistic explanations — even the most impressive explanations of some future neuroscience — are conditional explanations… . In a certain sense they are incomplete, for they can never explain that any natural law should take the form that it does. Even the most exhausting investigation cannot be exhaustive. Any explanation offered in terms of events and their effects is incomplete because it presupposes an account of the form of certain principles. (O’Neill, Constructions of Reason, Cambridge UP, 1989, p. 68)

And McCarty helpfully explains essentially the same point:

Our empirical characters are not events, but causal laws of events: specifically, of our actions. Empirical characters are laws by which substances in the phenomenal world operate; and it is absurd to suppose that the laws of empirical causality themselves have prior empirical causality… . So … we need not acknowledge any empirical causes of our characters. We can therefore be morally responsible for our empirical characters without being responsible for any prenatal causes. (162)