Kant's Theory of Evil: An Essay on the Dangers of Self-love and the Aprioricity of History

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Pablo Muchnik, Kant's Theory of Evil: An Essay on the Dangers of Self-love and the Aprioricity of History, Lexington Books, 2010, 216 pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739140161.

Reviewed by David Sussman, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign



Pablo Muchnik’s Kant’s Theory of Evil is an ambitious and fascinating attempt to find in Kant a morally interesting sense of human nature that is not just a substitution-instance of the general concept of a rational agent. Muchnik’s primary task is to reconcile the two seemingly incompatible accounts of the moral significance of human nature that Kant offers in his later works. In Kant’s historical/anthropological speculations (“Idea for a Universal History,” “Conjectural Beginning of Human History,” “Perpetual Peace,” et al.), he interprets evil in terms of a naturalistic, Rousseauian teleology. Nature has supposedly imbued human beings with a kind of “unsociable sociability” that engenders a continuous dialectical struggle for the esteem of others. This struggle is often ugly, but it gradually transforms us from unreflective animals into beings that can recognize themselves as free and equal members of a universal moral community.

Kant offers a much more Augustinian account of evil in the Religion. Supposedly, every immoral choice a person makes must be rooted in a fundamental maxim that she embraces for the general use of her freedom. This basic maxim determines the relative importance we attach to moral concerns and concerns of self-love, and so determines our overall moral “disposition.” The person who subordinates self-love to morality has a good disposition; the person who does the reverse is wicked. Since we are responsible for our disposition it too must be freely chosen. Yet insofar as this self-constituting choice determines the significance we attach to concerns of self-love, self-love cannot itself explain why anyone would freely choose an evil disposition in the first place.

In the Religion, Kant asserts that human nature harbors a kind of “radical evil” that accounts for how we might freely decide to subordinate the basic commitments of freedom to some kind of self-love. Kant claims that although radical evil is not essential to human beings, it is nevertheless necessarily present in all human beings, “even the best.” Such evil is supposedly inextirpable; we can deal with it in various ways, but a kind of resistance to the demands of morality always lurks within us as a potential source of corruption. Kant insists that although radical evil is an inescapable feature of human nature, we are nevertheless morally responsible for it, as something we freely bring upon ourselves and continuously embrace.

Most of Kant’s Theory of Evil is devoted to making sense of just what it could mean for humanity as such to have a specific moral nature, why some sort of resistance to morality must be a part of it, and how we could still be responsible for that nature despite its unavoidability. Muchnik rightly observes that Kant’s claims about human nature seem to straddle the divide between the pure (or a priori) and the empirical (a posteriori), at a level Muchnik calls the “quasi-transcendental.” Muchnik claims that to resolve these paradoxes, we need to appreciate how far Kant has moved beyond the methodological individualism of the Groundwork. The choice of fundamental disposition is something each person makes, but radical evil is something that the species as a whole freely elects, and for which we bear collective responsibility.

Unfortunately, Muchnik never really explains just what it means for the species to be the primary agent of a choice this way, or how its decisions might inform those of an individual without annulling her freedom. He is certainly right that, in the Religion, Kant has begun to think of humanity as a kind of collective agent that bears distinctive duties and responsibilities, but this would only relocate the paradoxes, rather than resolve them. If there is a puzzle about how an individual could freely choose to resist the law of his own free reason, there will be a similar puzzle about how a species of free, rational beings could do so collectively.

Muchnik does offer a “quasi-transcendental” argument for why some sort of “propensity to evil” must afflict us all, but that argument does not seem to depend on the distinction between individual and species agency in any interesting way. Instead, he argues that the root of our evil is to be found in our liability to a “vice of subreption.” We are guilty of such subreption when we misconstrue what is really an awareness of our own activity as an experience of something distinct from and prior to that activity. Muchnik observes that as autonomous creatures, we are implicitly committed to morality, and so typically take satisfaction in successful moral action. This pleasure is really just our sense of our own wills most fully determining and expressing themselves in light of law. Unfortunately, we are apt to take this pleasure not as an aspect or consequence of such self-determination, but rather as the ground of that determination in the first place. A moral person is characteristically pleased to do her duty, and so we may be tempted to conclude that our obligations are really grounded in such pleasure itself.

Muchnik has certainly identified a real “practical illusion” here that might be at work in some sentimentalist accounts of morality. However, it is hard to see how a liability to this subreption can make sense of Kant’s peculiar claims about the radical evil in our nature. Our radical evil is supposed to be something we freely adopt, and for which we are wholly responsible. The subreption Muchnik describes seems to be only an understandable confusion, really more an intellectual mistake than a kind of “perversity of the heart” that we actively and knowingly embrace. Muchnik replies that “Nothing that occurs within the inner sanctum of practical reason can escape the structure of obligation, and consequently, the burden of imputation. For Kant, the error we experience about the primacy of pleasure is an act of self-deception.” (75). Here he seems to insist that there cannot be any innocent or purely intellectual mistakes with respect to what we really care about, or what we are really acting for. But even if we allow this remarkable claim, it does not touch the basic problem. If subreption is morally imputable because it is not an innocent mistake but a kind of motivated irrationality, then we need some further account of the motivations that underlie it. Insofar as our liability to practical illusion depends on some secret longing to put self-love ahead of morality, subreption already presupposes the endemic resistance to reason that it was meant to explain.

Despite Muchnik’s efforts, Kant’s position seems to be trapped in a circle. As an aspect of human nature, radical evil has to assume the role of something like a psychological tendency that we are always confronting in ourselves. Such a tendency may explain why we make immoral choices, but only at the price of their freedom and imputability. On the other hand, if we are to sustain imputability, radical evil must take the guise of an activity we always find ourselves freely engaging in. But then the appeal to radical evil explains nothing about our basic misuse of freedom, since such evil simply is that misuse itself.

In the last chapter of Kant’s Theory of Evil, Muchnik turns to Kant’s “moral anthropology,” his comprehensive account of how our distinctive capacities, understood as free active powers, fit together in a unified form of human agency. Muchnik focuses on what Kant calls three basic “predispositions to good” along with the three levels of our ineliminable “propensity to evil.” Muchnik develops the novel claim that there is an implicit correspondence between the predispositions and these propensities. Each propensity, he claims, is meant to account for how a particular predisposition can be corrupted, and so used in a way that goes against its own natural moral purposes.

The predispositions to good are animality, humanity, and personality. Muchnik offers a Rousseauian interpretation of each. Animality is supposedly Kant’s name for Rousseau’s amour-de-soi, a kind of unreflective but “proto-rational” self-concern formed around our felt needs for food, sex, and social interaction. Humanity corresponds to amour-propre, our concern for the esteem and admiration of others that is a prime element of our “unsocial sociability.” Personality expresses itself in a conception of ourselves as equal, morally responsible beings who possess unconditional dignity independent of any of the ways in which they might differ as individuals.

Against these predispositions Kant sets three forms of our propensity to evil. Frailty is moral weakness of will, our liability to yield to the temptations of self-love despite our sincere commitment to morality above all. Impurity represents a kind of moral half-heartedness. Although we acknowledge the authority of the moral law, we are only actually moved to do our duty when we can also see it as serving our own happiness. The deepest level of the propensity is depravity, which is the radical evil of our fundamental on-going resistance to the moral law, a resistance that Muchnik argues underlies frailty and impurity as well.

Kant sees nothing fundamentally wrong with the desires constitutive of animality. Instead, he insists that we must take these needs seriously, and that it is wrong to satisfy these desires in ways that frustrate or pervert their “natural purposes.” Muchnik holds that in order for our healthy appetites for food and sex to turn into the “natural vices” of gluttony and lust, frailty must be involved, sustained by some kind of self-deception. Supposedly, for these appetites to tempt the agent, she must already be deceiving herself about what morality really requires, or about what she really is seeking. Were she to clearly face the fact that morality condemns these satisfactions, such temptations would lose all their appeal.

Muchnik contends that just as frailty explains the corruption of our relation to our own animality, impurity explains the corruption of humanity. The impure agent does care about morality, but here it is a kind of unacknowledged self-love that really guides his choices. Kant argues that such self-deception is made possible by our taking an external view of ourselves. That is, so long as he acts in what is outwardly the right manner, the impure agent is morally satisfied with himself, regardless of his true motives. Muchnik argues that in impurity we see the same kind of dependence on the opinions of others that, at its most extreme, turns our salutary competitiveness into the vices of envy, ingratitude, and Schadenfreude.

However, Kant never suggests that frailty involves any sort of self-deception, nor does he think that it only concerns our natural appetites. Frailty can manifest itself with any sort of non-moral concern, including those dependent on various culturally-informed ideals and self-conceptions. Muchnik’s argument presumes that Kant believes that when a sincerely moral agent sees that it would be wrong to satisfy some inclination she will lose all interest in it. Kant does think that this kind of responsiveness is characteristic of agents who have achieved perfect virtue. But he also thinks that such virtue is a condition we can never fully attain, but only asymptotically approach. Since we can never be fully virtuous, sincere moral commitment cannot preclude the possibility of persistent temptation. No self-deception is needed; frailty only presupposes that we care about more than one kind of thing, and that we are free.

The association of impurity with the corruption of humanity also seems forced. Admittedly, the self-deception that impurity depends on is possible only when we can care about how others see us, an attitude that finds its inception at the level of humanity. But as Kant describes it, the impure person is concerned not with how admirable their actions seem, but only with the “legality” of their behavior. The impure person is satisfied with herself so long as no other person is in a position to blame her, regardless of what her real motivations might be. Impurity seems to be enabled not by the distinctive concerns of humanity, but rather by the juridical dimensions of the moral point of view itself.

Kant’s Theory of Evil suffers from some significant omissions. There is no discussion of Kant’s account of the passions, which are a special class of inclinations that are supposedly able to vie with morality for ultimate authority over our wills. Muchnik also neglects Kant’s understanding of the development of virtue, and of how such a gradual change in our habits and feelings can count as the timeless, noumenal “revolution of the heart” that morality supposedly demands of us. Nevertheless, Kant’s Theory of Evil is a rich and stimulating work that directly confronts some of the most important and intractable problems of Kant’s ethics and moral psychology. Muchnik is undoubtedly right in claiming that in his later work, Kant is searching for a way of addressing the first-person experience of human life that is neither a form of naturalistic psychology nor just a part of a pure metaphysics of rational agency. Kant never quite figured out how to square this circle, but Kant’s Theory of Evil offers a promising account of how, from basic Kantian insights, we might go on to do so.