Kant's Theory of Virtue: The Value of Autocracy

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Anne Margaret Baxley, Kant's Theory of Virtue: The Value of Autocracy, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 189pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521766234.

Reviewed by Jeanine Grenberg, St. Olaf College


In this book, Baxley argues that Kantian virtue is, at its heart, what Kant calls "autocracy," a state in which an agent has rational self-rule over herself, thereby "tak[ing] the right attitude toward her sensible nature and manag[ing] it appropriately." (171) Although some would argue this is a notion of virtue in which emotions must simply be constrained, Baxley argues to the contrary that, while Kantian virtue (because it is informed by radical evil) cannot be Aristotelian in nature, the Kantian virtuous person nonetheless is enjoined by duty to control, maintain and even cultivate certain emotional states, all of which can result in a virtuous agent who is "at peace with herself, calm and tranquil, and yet always prepared to stand down the potential threat to good conduct that her propensity to evil could pose." (81) Virtue as autocracy is thus offered as a "distinctively modern, egalitarian conception of virtue which is an important and overlooked alternative to the more traditional Greek views which have dominated contemporary virtue ethics." (from book-jacket)

In setting this as her task, Baxley also faces a challenge, since her goal of undermining the misconception of Kant as having an overly rigid (or non-existent) moral psychology involves taking up questions already well-defined by and well-discussed in recent secondary literature. My worry, therefore, as I began to read this book was whether Baxley could really further the conversation in this already much-discussed area. And in fact, one does find a certain overlap in Baxley's work. In Chapter One, for example, although her summary of the challenges raised by Bernard Williams and Michael Stocker about the motive of duty is admirably clear, her analysis -- which appeals to things like duty as a primary or secondary motive (26), duty as a limiting condition upon inclination-based motives (27), the distinction between action accompanied versus motivated by inclination (32), and the import of counterfactual situations (35) -- at times explicitly and at times implicitly relies heavily on distinctions already made clear in Barbara Herman's work. Similar implicit overlap with my own discussion of Kantian virtue can be found in Chapters Two and Four, where Baxley emphasizes that virtue is a response to radical evil (i.e., the tendency to prefer the self to moral demands) and not simply to inclinations (Section 2.3). The result is an important role for virtue in containing one's sensible nature (see, e.g.,73-74), in addition to the possibility of the positive cultivation of that nature (Chapter 4), ideas which are central in my own work on Kantian virtue.

Yet Baxley also succeeds in furthering these conversations. Her discussion of the motive of duty, for example, insists whole-heartedly (and, I think, rightly) both that "Kant is [not] wedded to any rigid view about the content of practical deliberation" (28) and that, nonetheless, "moral considerations should authoritatively govern [one's] conduct" at all times. (28) Her Kant thus challenges Williams' and Susan Wolf's hopes that "sometimes considerations based on love and personal attachment silence moral considerations." (29n33) Baxley characterizes the motive of duty as a broader notion than Williams' or Stocker's caricature of it, but not so broad as to allow soft-heartedness about our love for particular individuals to blind us to the fact that morality informs all aspects of one's life, and not just a small part of it. This is a position that needs to be heard more strongly in this ongoing debate, and it is pleasing to see Baxley claim it as strongly as she does.

Baxley also furthers the conversation about Kant's conception of virtue. One aspect of her account is particularly compelling: she unapologetically and whole-heartedly claims just that point about Kantian virtue which many would tout as its weakness, viz., that even the most virtuous person must struggle against internal obstacles to morality. She does so by placing autocracy ("an actualized power of self-governance" which utilizes the will to put into action those universally valid rational laws legislated by one's will, 59) at the heart of Kant's conception of virtue. She thereby defends a notion of virtue which, while allowing for the shaping and cultivating of feeling in accordance with laws of reason, always leaves open at least the possibility of temptations toward the immoral. The import of Kant's reference to the struggles human agents encounter in their efforts to be virtuous is, I think, an underappreciated point in current discussions of Kantian ethics. And although I might go even further than Baxley does in affirming its import (suggesting, for example, that, because of our tendency toward self-deception, struggle plays an important moral epistemic role as well as a role in virtue, an idea Baxley rejects when she claims that "morality, as Kant understands it, is epistemically easy, but executively difficult," 83), her own affirmation of the centrality of struggle in human moral lives is refreshing, and welcome.

Most importantly, Baxley relies upon this appeal to struggle in our moral lives to define the difference between virtue and continence. For her, virtue and continence are not distinguished along traditional Aristotelian lines (where virtue involves no internal opposition to moral demands and continence involves doing the right thing despite internal opposition to it) but along truly Kantian lines (where virtue involves only potential temptation to immorality because of our ever-present propensity to place self above morality, whereas continence involves actual temptation to immorality from the same source). (133) As such, "Kant is able to mark a clear distinction between virtue and continence in his own terms, and this is sufficient to rule out the charge that he reduces virtue to continence." (82) I am in great sympathy with this idea that, because of their differing accounts of human nature (which for Kant involves admission of radical evil), we need to define the Kantian distinction between virtue and continence differently than the Aristotelian one (since the latter involves perfect organization of the person in accordance with right reason and is simply unattainable for human agents with a propensity toward evil). Baxley's new definition of the distinction between virtue and continence, Kantian style, allows us to reaffirm the important distinction between them.

The advance made by Baxley's account is perhaps as much rhetorical as it is based in this new distinction. Baxley so fully enters the space of all of us as tempted beings that she shifts the perspective from which "virtue theorists" are entitled to speak. No longer must we assume that the pursuit of virtue is simply the pursuit of a quasi-divine, Aristotelian "full virtue" in which one worries that the virtue theorists are more interested in themselves than morality. This virtue theorist claims our corruption as whole-heartedly as she does our pursuit of virtue, and this is to be welcomed.

There are, however, some questions to raise about the picture Baxley draws of the distinction between virtue and continence. Although she does draw this distinction by relying on the further distinction between potential versus actual temptation (133), at other times she distinguishes it by saying that the virtuous person is "not (seriously) tempted to act contrary to duty," (82) whereas the continent person "is (seriously) tempted to act contrary to duty, though she resists acting on temptation." (82) This indicates some uncertainty on Baxley's part about just how to draw the virtue/continence distinction. Might she leave room, for example, for a non-serious but still actual temptation within the virtuous person? How, though, would one draw the line between serious and non-serious temptations? Can we speak of having an actual temptation which we are absolutely (or pretty?) certain we would never act upon? Given Kant's well-known claim about the opacity of our motives to ourselves, we should be hesitant to claim any great confidence in such self-assessments of what is and isn't tempting us "seriously".

Perhaps Baxley will want to retreat at this point to the actual/potential distinction, which is at least clearer, but this has its own problems: can Kant really accept the possibility of a human agent having absolutely no actual temptations? This seems too high a bar to set even for merely human virtue, "which is always in progress." (6:409/167, emphases removed and added; quoted at Baxley 132). Baxley herself does admit that even "perfect autocracy fully realized" is only an ideal, one characterized by the image of "the sage." (82) Yet this move only further muddles the distinction between virtue and continence: if full Kantian virtue, as she defines it, is unattainable by human agents, mustn't we then admit that actual virtue for Kant is merely continence? I agree with Baxley, then, that the distinction between virtue and continence has to be different for Kant than for Aristotle; I further agree that the distinction is a matter of degree in which the virtuous person has less and the continent person more temptations (but in which both succeed in not allowing temptations to guide action). Yet I am not quite sure just how to identify the degree of the presence or absence of temptations that defines this distinction. One must, in any event, be very, very careful about saying of oneself that "I have only potential and not actual temptation."

A further concern about Baxley's account of virtue is the question of just how much she wants to distinguish Kantian virtue from Aristotelian virtue. We have already signed on with Baxley's distinction between the two on the question of just how fully one can organize one's character in accordance with rational principles. But there is still the further question of whether we, nonetheless, find interesting overlap in Kantian and Aristotelian moral psychologies. Early on, in Chapter Two, Baxley seems to be setting us up for a large contrast between Aristotelian and Kantian virtue on this point. Virtue, for Aristotle, "involves correct decision as well as appropriate desires," that is "appetites and emotions … trained to harmonize with correct choice." (62-63) But, "By contrast, Kantian autocracy at least initially appears to be a form of moral self-governance that requires a rational crackdown on appetites and emotions, demanding their compliance." (63)

Of course, we eventually find that, although we always need to leave room for the possibility of states contrary to morality within one's character, autocracy does not demand simply a "crackdown" on the emotions, but instead allows not only for their maintenance but also for their cultivation in accordance with rational principles:

on the picture he paints when he is concerned to show that feelings and desires that are shaped by right action are important for good character, Kant makes clear that morality requires that we cultivate certain emotions, desires, and attitudes as part of the content of virtue. (124)

One expects, then, that Baxley will happily announce a rapprochement between the moral psychology of Aristotle and Kant, since both encourage the cultivation of emotions and appetites in accordance with reason. But instead we find little explicit return to discussion of Aristotle himself, combined with continued broad claims about large distinctions to be made between Kantian and Aristotelian virtue. For example, Baxley asserts that Kantian virtue does not involve the pursuit of excellence and, indeed, that this fact about it is what assures that Kant has a distinctively non-Aristotelian account of virtue:

Kant thinks virtue is better understood to involve self-mastery and self-constraint in accordance with reason under adverse conditions and difficult odds, as opposed to intrinsic excellence and self-realization, as more traditional Greek views about character tend to emphasize. (83, emphasis added)

Here, Baxley seems to assert that Kantian virtue is not at all about excellence and self-realization but is instead fully defined by self-mastery and self-constraint. And yet this claim places her in tension with her own later claims, cited above, about how autocracy can involve not just the containment or the maintenance of our feelings but also, sometimes, their positive cultivation. As such, this reader finds that virtue as autocracy does involve something identifiable as the pursuit of "excellence," for example, the excellence of shaping one's natural sympathies into morally guided sympathy: "We … have an obligation to cultivate our natural aesthetic feelings of sympathy and 'to make use of them as so many means to sympathy based on moral principles and the feeling appropriate to them' (MS 6:457;575)." (162-163). And, although Baxley's account discusses only duties of virtue to others, a quick look at the Metaphysics of Morals suggests that the pursuit of excellence à la Kant can also very easily include something that looks a lot like the "self-realization" Baxley claims is not a part of Kantian virtue: "A human being has a duty to himself to cultivate … his natural powers … and to be in a pragmatic respect a human being equal to the end of his existence." (6:444-445/194)

I do not mean to suggest here that Kantian pursuit of excellence would be exactly identical to Aristotelian pursuit of excellence, as it is always the case for Kantians that the pursuit of excellences occurs within the context of the containment of parts of ourselves. And yet it still seems to me that the grand claims Baxley makes about Kantian virtue being "opposed" to Aristotelian virtue on the grounds of excellence and self-realization are too strongly stated.

Baxley makes a similarly strong claim of opposition between Kant and Aristotle when she asserts in a footnote that

Kant's insistence that virtue must be understood in terms of morally good maxims and (continually purified) principles of volition serves to distinguish his view from Aristotle's more familiar account of virtue as a mean state with respect to feelings and inclinations, one acquired by habituation and education. (132n4)

One wishes Baxley would have said more here. On the one hand, we can perhaps easily admit that, because of its appeal to maxims of the will, virtue isn't a mean for Kant. Indeed, there are large questions to be asked here about how an account of virtue which appeals to a notion of "will" compares with one (like Aristotle's) in which the notion of will is unrecognized. And of course, Baxley's insistence on virtue as autocracy underscores the point that Kantian virtue most centrally involves acts of will. Yet once we admit that the activity of willing is the activity of practical reason, then the difference between a virtue theory involving the activity of the will cultivating our emotional life and the Aristotelian activity of right reason cultivating our emotional life begins to diminish. In any event, it seems far too quick an assessment to say, simply because Kantian virtue involves appeal to maxims of the will, that it is not "acquired by habituation and education." Indeed, Baxley's own account of how the virtuous agent cultivates sympathy, for example, in accordance with rational principles of the will has got to involve some Kantian form of both habituation and education. Of course, both will look slightly different than Aristotelian versions of habituation and education (the former involving more what Kant would call an "aptitude" instead of a habit [see 6:407/165] and the latter helping those being educated to understand principles as well as the training of their emotions [see, e.g., 6:477ff/221ff]). But Baxley's account of virtue as autocracy has done nothing to convince this reader that virtue does not require the slow, repeated revisiting, development and education of our emotional lives.

One wishes, in the end, that Baxley had spent a bit more time directly engaging both Aristotle and extant interpreters of Kant and Aristotle as she made her definitive claims distinguishing Kantian from Aristotelian virtue. Nonetheless, I am happy to welcome Baxley's voice as another feeling-interested interpreter of Kant's practical philosophy. Reading her book has convinced me there is more to say on this already much-discussed topic.