Kant's Transcendental Arguments: Disciplining Pure Reason

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Scott Stapleford, Kant's Transcendental Arguments: Disciplining Pure Reason, Continuum, 2008, 152pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826499288.

Reviewed by Corey W. Dyck, University of Western Ontario


There has recently been a revival of interest in the notion of a transcendental argument, and in this slim volume Scott Stapleford seeks to cast light on the nature and purpose of such arguments by considering how Kant himself understood and employed them in the Critique of Pure Reason.[1] Through consideration of neglected portions of the Doctrine of Method and analysis of the Second Analogy and Refutation of Idealism, Stapleford contends that we find a much less ambitious sort of transcendental argument than expected, namely, one only intended to yield the modest conclusion that "certain forms of conceptualization are necessary conditions of our having the type of experience that we do" (p. 6). Stapleford thinks this result functions as a "limited historical corrective" (p. 131) for those epistemologists who would invoke Kant as a source and authority for arguments intended to license claims of extra-mental existence.

The very idea of the transcendental argument as an effective weapon against the skeptic was challenged in an influential paper by Barry Stroud, and in chapter one Stapleford attempts to distinguish the sense of transcendental argument found in Kant's texts from that which was subject to, or was developed in light of, Stroud's criticism. According to Stroud, a transcendental argument which purports to show "that certain particular concepts are necessary for experience or thought"[2] is of limited utility against the skeptic. While it might show that some belief (say, in the existence of a world of objects) is a condition of some meaningful assertion made by the skeptic, the skeptic is free to maintain that the truth of this belief cannot be known. If the argument is buttressed by a verificationist assumption, according to which the meaningfulness of an assertion implies that its truth can be ascertained, then the transcendental argument simply piggybacks on the verificationist premise in refuting the skeptic. Granting that Stroud's criticism precludes using such arguments against the skeptic who challenges knowledge claims, Robert Stern has recently argued that transcendental arguments are nonetheless effectively deployed against the "justificatory skeptic" who doubts whether a given belief can be justified in light of some common inferential or non-inferential norms. Stapleford finds such recourse to be hasty, however. In the Doctrine of Method, Kant indicates that he is, in fact, interested in rigorizing the skeptical method so that it does not foment a general distrust of reason but instead lays bare its limits. Transcendental arguments, when employed alongside the doctrine of transcendental idealism, actually contribute to this end by demonstrating that some concept is a condition of the possibility of objects as they appear to us but without licensing any claim about those objects as they are in themselves. So, Stroud's original objection that a transcendental argument cannot yield claims about the way the world is apart from the ways in which we are constrained to think about it is actually quite compatible with Kant's own philosophical intentions.

In chapter two, Stapleford turns to a more detailed consideration of what Kant's transcendental arguments prove, and how they do so. Despite Kant's apparently conflicting claims regarding such arguments, Stapleford maintains that a transcendental argument argues a priori for a synthetic conclusion, namely, that two concepts "converge," or are extensionally but not intensionally equivalent (p. 44), and it does so by means of an examination of the "instantiation conditions," the corresponding intuitions, for each of the concepts. Stapleford takes these as possible, rather than actual, experiences and intuitions, that is, "the possibility of experiencing an object corresponding to some concept" (p. 51), which he takes to preserve the a priori character of the argument. Applying this to the Second Analogy yields a novel interpretation of its argumentative strategy. Kant is now shown to demonstrate that any possible instance to which the concept event can be applied is necessarily also a possible instance to which the concept cause can be applied, and vice versa, since "the perceptual sequences we think of as representing events just are those sequences we think of as representing causal series" (p. 58). The result is an argument with an anti-empiricistic thrust as the empirical concept of event is shown to be "tied by conditions of instantiation" (p. 61) to the pure concept of cause.

Here, however, I find that Stapleford's analysis is vulnerable to a number of objections. Kant claims that, with regard to principles like that of the Second Analogy, it is the "possibility of experience … which gives all of our cognitions a priori objective reality" (A156/B195). Stapleford's understanding of a transcendental argument depends (he admits) on taking the "possibility of experience" to be synonymous with "a possible experience"; thus, the convergence of two concepts is demonstrated through representing the instantiating instances of both through the imagination and recognizing their equivalence. Yet, while Kant is, as always, frustratingly inconsistent in employing these terms, it seems to me that the distinction between demonstrating that a pure concept is a condition of the possibility of experience and imagining a possible experience to serve as an instance of a concept is, and ought to be, generally recognized in Kant's texts. To prove that a concept is a condition of the possibility of experience involves showing that some essential aspect of our experience would be lacking without the use of the concept in question, whereas a possible experience is just a putative synthesis of perceptions that is consistent with these formal conditions themselves (cf. the first Postulate -- A218/B265). Rather than simply pointing to possible instances that fall under the concept, then, the Second Analogy attempts to prove the objective reality of the causal principle by showing it to be a condition of the possibility of experience, and in particular, a condition of cognizing the temporal relation of succession (A177/B219). In addition, reading the Second Analogy specifically in light of this understanding of transcendental arguments actually makes it more difficult to see the difference between Kant's and the empiricistic conception of causality. Hume's conclusion regarding causality could be readily rephrased in the language of convergence as he takes the idea of necessary connection to amount to little more than the idea of regular succession. Though Kant is taken to arrive at this conclusion by a different avenue (through a consideration of possible rather than actual experience), it is not clear that his result differs from Hume's in anything but emphasis, and this makes it unclear why Kant should be taken to offer an argument against the empiricist rather than merely an alternative (if that).

In the third chapter, Stapleford offers a reading of the Refutation of Idealism in line with his contention that the goal of a transcendental argument is not a weighty ontological conclusion but only to show that a pure concept is part of the framework of experience. Though the former view has been defended by Paul Guyer, for whom the Refutation seeks (unsuccessfully) to prove that the existence of objects numerically distinct from our representations is a condition of inner experience, Stapleford argues, convincingly, that much of the key evidence for Guyer's view is ambivalent between realist and idealist positions. Accordingly, Stapleford contends that the Refutation is intended only to show that the existence of empirically external, or phenomenological, objects is presupposed by inner experience. Furthermore, Stapleford argues that the Refutation conforms to the model of transcendental argument that he outlined with respect to the Second Analogy. Stapleford takes the Refutation as a reductio in form, intended to show that the alleged Cartesian starting-point of mere inner experience actually involves the "immediate consciousness of the existence of outer things" (B276n). In order to prove this, Kant invites us to instantiate the merely logical I think as an object of putative experience and then regressively consider the conditions of doing so. Since any experience of ourselves must adhere to the principle of the First Analogy, and since nothing persistent is given in inner intuition, only outer intuition remains as the source of the representation of something persistent. This leads Stapleford to draw the anti-Cartesian conclusion that there is no unmixed inner experience but that any cognition of ourselves "is only possible through outer, spatial intuition", which he takes to imply that I must "assign my representations to my own body as their bearer" (p. 92).

Here I think the strictures of Stapleford's own analysis have forced upon him an unnecessarily narrow conception of inner experience as involving the intuition of a subject abiding over time. Were this all that Kant intended by inner experience, then the Refutation would be a largely redundant exercise given that at A107 Kant, following (perhaps) Hume, had already denied the possibility of such experience based on the lack of any such intuition of the self. Stapleford concedes this though he thinks the Refutation goes slightly further than the previous denial in "arguing that there couldn't be a purely temporal perception of the subject" (92). It seems to me, however, that there is a distinct and far weaker, and thus less contentious, notion of inner experience at issue in the Refutation, one that is explored in greater detail in the well-known Reflexion 5661 entitled: "Answering the question: Is it an experience that we think?" and which, as far as I can tell, Stapleford does not refer to. After claiming that the mere thought of a square does not amount to an experience, Kant goes on to write:

Yet, this thought produces an object of experience, or a determination of the mind, that can be observed, namely, insofar as it [the mind] is affected through the faculty of thinking; I can say therefore that I have experienced what belongs to the grasping of a figure of four equal sides and four right angles in thought such that I can demonstrate the properties of it. This is the empirical consciousness of the determination of my state in time through thinking; thinking itself, even though it also happens in time, pays absolutely no heed to time when the properties of a figure are to be thought. Experience, however, without the determination of time being bound with it is impossible because in that case I am passive and feel myself affected in accordance with the formal condition of inner sense. (AA 18.319 -- my emphases)

Though this is a dense passage, for present purposes it will suffice to outline the relevant points.[3] Inner experience does not involve any intuition of the self but rather a manifold of inner intuition (the "determination[s] of the mind") generated by "affecting ourselves through the faculty of thinking" or attending to a given representation (B156-7n). Here, the inner manifold comprises the successive determinations of the mind generated in the course of attentively constructing a geometrical object. We can talk of an experience of this manifold, however, only insofar as its various components are taken to stand to one another in the relation of objective succession, that is, as preceding or following one another. The fact this experience is an experience of a temporal order among determinations of my own mind is why this experience is taken to amount to the determination of my existence in time; thus Kant concludes that "[c]onsciousness, when I institute [anstelle] an experience, is [the] representation of my existence insofar as it is empirically determined, that is in time" (AA 18.319). This is precisely the jumping-off point for the Refutation, which considers the conditions of such temporal determination. And because this genuinely inner experience is understood merely in terms of assigning an objective temporal order to my inner states, and not in terms of an intuition of the self, Kant could clearly accept it and, indeed, so could the Cartesian idealist (not to mention the Humean).

Though I disagree with Stapleford on many of the interpretive and philosophical details, I am inclined to agree with him that Kant's transcendental arguments are a much less effective weapon against global forms of skepticism than is widely thought, and that this is completely consonant with Kant's own philosophical intentions. Unfortunately, Stapleford does not draw the clear conclusion from this: if the Critique only offers rebuttals and refutations of weakly skeptical positions, then this says as much about Kant's intended targets as it does about Kant. This would suggest that a comprehensive understanding of the purpose, and utility, of Kant's transcendental arguments can only be gained through a detailed consideration of the specific forms which skepticism and idealism took in Kant's own time. Kant's Transcendental Arguments serves as a useful (if at times flawed) reminder that Kant's philosophical concerns are frequently divergent from our own, yet it seems to me that any treatment of this issue which, like Stapleford's, focuses solely on Kant's texts will inevitably prove incomplete.

[1] Translations from the Kritik der reinen Vernunft are taken from The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant: Critique of Pure Reason, ed. and trans. P. Guyer and A. Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1998) and refer to the pagination in the first "A" and, where appropriate, to the second, "B" edition. Other citations of Kant's works refer to the volume and page number in the so-called "Akademie Ausgabe" of Kant's gesammelte Schriften [AA] (Berlin: de Gruyter, et. al., 1900).

[2] See Barry Stroud, "Transcendental Arguments", Journal of Philosophy 65 (1968), pp. 241-56; 243.

[3] For a more detailed consideration of some of the issues raised by this passage, see my "Empirical Consciousness Explained: The Connection between Self-Affection, (Self-) Consciousness, and Perception in the B Deduction", Kantian Review 11 (2006), pp. 29-54.