Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, Revised and Enlarged Edition

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Henry E. Allison, Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, Revised and Enlarged Edition, Yale University Press, 2004, 560pp, $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 0300102666.

Reviewed by Sebastian Gardner, University College, London


The publication in 1983 of Henry Allison's Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense marked a turning point in anglophone Kant scholarship. The extremely high level of Allison's scholarship, his careful illumination of the fine grain of Kant's first Critique, and above all the exciting way in which he restored plausibility and interest to Kant's idealism -- a dimension of Kant that seemed previously to have withered away under the contempt of successive generations -- provided a model for the practice of history of philosophy. Allison showed how sympathetic attention to historical figures can be every bit as philosophically fruitful as non-historical modes of enquiry standard in analytic philosophy; where Strawson's Kant held philosophical interest but lacked historical conviction, Allison's Kant had a strong claim to both titles. Allison's interpretation of Kant's theoretical philosophy has received and continues to receive an enormous quantity of attention, and it is a measure of its richness that after two decades of criticism, and in a sphere where the opportunities for interpretative diversity and disagreement are legion, a significant number of those who work on Kant are persuaded that Allison's account of Kant's transcendental idealism is basically correct. Since 1983 Allison has published a book on Kant's moral theory and theory of freedom, another on Kant's aesthetics, and a collection of essays on a variety of central topics in Kant's philosophy, many of which extend discussions in Kant's Transcendental Idealism, but the new edition of this book is an important further step in the development of Allison's Kant picture.

The second edition of Kant's Transcendental Idealism contains substantial revisions and additions which expand the scope of the first in several respects. First, the range of issues and textual sections from the first Critique which are subjected to detailed scrutiny is enlarged, and second, the account given of how Kant's transcendental idealism is integral to his treatment of epistemological and metaphysical themes has been deepened. The relevant textual changes are summarised by Allison in the new Preface (pp. xviii-xix): the discussion of the Transcendental Analytic has been expanded to include the metaphysical deduction of the categories (in a chapter of its own) and the Third Analogy (within a single chapter treating all three Analogies together), and an account has been added of the relation of the Refutation of Idealism to transcendental idealism (a topic which allows Allison to engage with Paul Guyer, for whom the Refutation represents Kant's achievement in finally carrying his philosophy beyond the restrictive bounds of transcendental idealism). In addition the book closes with two new chapters, one on the Ideal of Pure Reason, and the other on the regulative role of reason, reflecting changes in Allison's view of dialectical illusion, which he acknowledges to derive from the stimulus of his former student Michelle Grier (whose Kant's Doctrine of Transcendental Illusion appeared with CUP in 2001). The effect of these changes is to provide a more rounded picture of the first Critique, in particular, it corrects the much heavier weighting given in the original edition, as in so much Kant commentary, to the Transcendental Aesthetic and Transcendental Analytic, at the expense of the Transcendental Dialectic.

Much space would be required to begin to do justice to Allison's discussions. Instead I will concentrate on the third respect in which the revised edition makes an advance. This concerns what is of broadest and for most readers likely to be of greatest interest: Allison has rethought and in some ways altered his understanding of Kant's idealism. While some changes in Allison's thinking could be gleaned from papers that he has published previously -- in particular, 'Transcendental idealism: a retrospective', chapter 1 of Idealism and Freedom (Cambridge: CUP, 1996) -- the degree to which they jointly compose something new becomes clear only with this second edition.

Allison signals the importance that he attaches to his revised account of transcendental idealism, explaining its motivation in the Preface and devoting the first chapter (''Introduction to the Problem'') to a statement of what it consists in. As he affirms, the landscape has changed considerably since 1983. Whereas originally Allison introduced his interpretation of transcendental idealism by means of relatively few contrasts, principally H. A. Prichard and Strawson, the present horizon of Kantian studies includes also, among others, Paul Guyer, Rae Langton, and Karl Ameriks, all of whom have criticised Allison and formulated opposing positions on the nature of transcendental idealism. Allison intends his revised interpretation of transcendental idealism also to counter what he believes to be the increased Strawsonian tendency to regard Kant's transcendental idealism as separable from the other main components of his theoretical philosophy.

Allison continues to describe his account of transcendental idealism as ''epistemological'', ''methodological'', or ''metaepistemological'' (p. 4), as opposed to ontological, but now takes a different view of its centre of gravity. Previously this was located in what Allison called Kant's innovative notion of an ''epistemic condition''. He now locates it in what he calls Kant's ''discursivity thesis''. The former notion is that of a necessary condition for cognition that is non-logical and non-psychological yet explanatory of things' becoming objects for us; epistemic conditions are ''vehicles'' of cognition, conditions that fulfill an ''objectivating function'' (p. 11). The discursivity thesis is in brief the thesis that human cognition requires a conjunction of sensible intuition and active, spontaneous conceptuality. Allison considers that recognition of the way in which Kant's discursivity thesis provides the ''key to understanding his idealism'' (p. xv) makes clearer the metaepistemological character of Allison's interpretation -- Kant's idealism ''is grounded in an analysis of the discursive nature of human cognition'' (p. 4) -- and at the same time provides transcendental idealism with a deeper and firmer foundation. The new order of argument is as follows. (1) The discursivity thesis, though most often figuring in Kant as a premise, can be established on the following basis (pp. 13-14): (i) cognition in general requires the presence of an object in intuition, intuition is either sensible or intellectual, and our intuition, being non-creative, cannot be intellectual, so must be sensible; (ii) intuition is insufficient, and conceptuality necessary, for cognition (this being a result of the Analytic). (2) The discursivity thesis, though not itself idealistic, entails idealism, because the requirement that intuitions and concepts be conjoined in the requisite way (viz. receptive intuition combined with active conceptuality) gives rise to a requirement of ''original orderability'' (p. 14) on the part of sensible material, which can be satisfied only when orderability is regarded as ''a contribution of the cognitive subject'' (p. 14). The necessity of a priori forms of sensibility -- of epistemic conditions -- is thereby established. (3) Next comes the transcendental distinction of appearances and things in themselves. Central to Allison's project from the outset has been the intention to distance Kant from the familiar pastiche assumed by detractors of transcendental idealism, hence Allison's emphasis on its ''non-ontological'' character. At the same time Allison recognises that in order for his construal of transcendental idealism to count as an interpretation in the fullest historical sense, rather than just a rational reconstruction, it is necessary to make sense of Kant's apparently positive use of the concept of the thing in itself in expressing the content of transcendental idealism and in arguing for the doctrine. Allison's solution, now well known, is a distinctive kind of ''two-aspect'' theory. To talk of things in themselves, on his account, is to talk of the very same objects that we commonly cognise but under the novel qualification that they are considered without reference to the conditions (epistemic conditions, in Allison's sense) under which we cognise them. The phrase ''… in themselves'' is an adverbial modifier specifying our mode of consideration of (given, spatio-temporal) objects. (4) The final, confirmatory step in Kant's argument consists in a critique of transcendental idealism's only logical competitor, transcendental realism, defined as the denial of epistemic conditions. This critique includes a diagnostic component, based on the theory of transcendental illusion.

This new configuration contrasts with the more standard view of Kant, on which the considerations which lead Kant to the joint necessity of intuitions and concepts, and his view of their manner of combination, and those which lead Kant to idealism, are merely parallel and intertwined. Allison's new and more intricate construal yields a more unified Kant, whose epistemology and idealism are both borne by a single line of argument, and it also responds to the criticism that Allison fails to argue convincingly for the necessity of ''epistemic conditions'' in a non-innocuous, idealism-implying sense, since this necessity is now derived rather than (as it has seemed to some of his critics) posited ab initio.

A unifying theme in the criticisms that have come from Guyer, Langton, and Ameriks is the suggestion that Allison, in repudiating an ontological dimension, offers an excessively thin (''trivialised'', ''anodyne'') account of the idealism in Kant's doctrine. All three critics urge instead more metaphysically substantial readings (though they construe this differently and come to very different conclusions regarding its defensibility). Allison believes that he can rebut this criticism (pp. 18-19). First, Allison appeals to his (new) account of transcendental illusion as adding bite to his version of transcendental idealism. Second, focusing on Langton's observation that Allison makes the non-spatio-temporality of things in themselves follow analytically from the concept of a thing in itself, Allison points out that analyticity does not entail triviality, so long as the distinction that makes the analytic inference possible -- here, the distinction of empirical and transcendental modes of consideration -- is not itself trivial. Both parts of Allison's response are to the point, but some new questions are raised. These are best approached through a consideration of some of what Allison considers wrong with the traditional ontological reading.

Allison acknowledges that Ameriks' ontological reading of things-in-themselves talk can seem to be favoured by much in the surface of Kant's texts (p. 46). Yet it ''founders'', he says (p. 46), on the objection that it contradicts Kant's empirical realism. This seems to me unconvincing or at any rate under-argued. Kant's empirical realism requires indeed a deep difference of status between physical objects and phenomenal entities, but to say that tables and chairs have a lesser degree of reality than things in themselves is not to phenomenalise them. Nor, pending a demonstration that pre-philosophical consciousness attributes absolute reality to tables and chairs, is it to contradict common sense, which can accept happily that there are other things with a higher degree of reality. The distinction implied by Ameriks is thus not one between how things ''merely seem to us to be'' (p. 46) and how they really are, but between how things really are for us, and how things Really really are, how they are in-and-for-themselves.

Allison again concedes (p. 46) that Ameriks' ontological reading is apparently required for the purpose of making sense of Kant's practical metaphysics of the supersensible. The standard solution adopted at this point by non-ontological interpreters of Kant is to insist that our supersensible freedom exists only from the practical point of view. Allison thinks however, surely correctly, that this is unsatisfactory (Is being free from a merely practical point of view being really free?). Consequently he next makes a bold and highly original move. The way in which the question ''Are we really free?'' ''keeps returning'' shows that ''we cannot help assuming that there must be some fact of the matter'' (p. 49), but what a correct understanding of Kant's theory of transcendental illusion leads us to grasp, Allison says, is precisely that there is no fact of the matter regarding our really being or not being free. Transcendental idealism has, Allison contends, something in common here with Dummett's anti-realism (p. 48).

At first blush Allison's transposition of the anti-realist structure which Dummett elaborates with respect to empirical knowledge, and which Kant invokes to dissolve the similarly empirically-concerned mathematical antinomies, to the context of things in themselves, appears odd: Kant's explanation for how it is possible to avoid regarding appearances as forming a sum-total that must be either finite or infinite -- namely, that appearances are not things in themselves -- employs a contrast between a kind of thing whose being is fully determinate and one whose being is not, a contrast between a realm of objects fit for truth and one fit for mere warranted assertibility. The appearance of oddness is removed, however, when it is appreciated that the transcendental illusion invoked by Allison is of a higher-level sort than the illusions identified in Kant's Dialectic: it is not the illusion that certain facts obtain (that God exists, etc.), but the illusion that there could be (that reason can have any conception of there being) any facts of the matter beyond empirical facticity.

It is to be noted that this goes one large step beyond the thesis (of Grier's) that transcendental illusion is ineliminable: to claim that reason's projection of the specific ideas of God, etc. cannot be terminated through transcendental insight is not to claim that the idea-forming and -projecting, the would-be representational function of reason is as such, necessarily and of itself, illusory. Allison does not put his claim in quite these terms: what he says is that on his account what is impugned is not reason as such in its extra-logical, ''real use'', but rather merely its association with transcendental realism (e.g. p. 332). Yet it is hard to see how space can be maintained between the two. While it can be denied that transcendental realism is available as an interpretation of empirical cognition without it being denied that empirical cognition has objective reality, since its objects may be (and, if Kant is right, must be) appearances, to deny that transcendental realism is available as an interpretation of pure reason just is, it would seem, to deny the possibility that its ideas have objective reality: its would-be concepts of objects cannot be concepts of appearances, and so have nowhere to go for the possibility of an object. Allison does seem to be committed, therefore, to the strong claim that the object-modelling, would-be representational function of reason is illicit, and this creates a difficulty: if there is something illegitimate, not simply with the attribution of objective reality to ideas of the unconditioned (with taking the unconditioned to be ''given'', as Kant puts it), but with the very idea of the unconditioned, then the regulative role of reason with respect to the understanding threatens to collapse. Allison is fully sensitive to the danger that discrediting reason's claims to objective reality may undercut its regulative function, and the theory of reason's regulativity is a portion of Kant's theoretical philosophy which, far from wishing to downplay, Allison expressly defends against those who regard the Kantian package of regulative principles as gratuitous and dispensable, arguing that it gets its warrant from epistemic norms, explanatory commitments, that not even a positivist can disavow (pp. 330-2; chapter 15 provides an extended, and magnificently subtle, account and defence of reason's regulativity). Allison's solution in essence is to distinguish sharply (pp. 312, 329-30) the demand for the unconditioned, the form of which is imperatival and non-assertoric, from all assertoric claims (to objective reality), arguing that, on account of this difference of logical mood, the illegitimacy of the latter leaves the former untouched. However, while it is quite true that the logical difference of imperatives and assertions means that reason's regulative principles cannot be illegitimate in the very same way as its assertions, it by no means follows that reason's imperatives are immune to charges of illegitimacy; and if the idea of the unconditioned is not one that could have objective reality, then arguably the imperative to seek the unconditioned makes no more sense than the instruction to draw a square circle. Untoward implications regarding the possibility of pure practical reason may be argued also to follow.

Even supposing Dummettian insight can be attributed to Kant, and that the regulative role of reason and its pure practical use are not threatened, another problem arises. Allison accepts that to affirm freedom from the merely practical point of view leaves us worried whether we are really free. But if this is so -- if we continue to worry, even after our self-ascription of freedom has been shown to possess warranted assertibility -- this must be because the need of our reason here is for transcendental reality; in which case, how can the knowledge that there is no fact of supersensible freedom reassure us that our self-attribution of freedom is not empty? The use of anti-realism to solve theoretical problems appears to create a practical, axiological one, which may in turn drive us back to the traditional and more textually obvious reading of Kant as designing the Critical system in such a way as to allow the noumenalist-realist need of reason to be fulfilled in the only sphere where it truly matters, viz. the practico-moral.

One final observation concerns the impact of Allison's new anti-realist theory of transcendental illusion on the issue of the alleged anodynity of his interpretation of transcendental idealism.

As noted above, Allison's interpretation of the concept of a thing in itself as ''a thing that we cognise considered apart from the conditions under which we are able to cognise it'' is not intended to express a conceptual absurdity -- Allison is not one of those who pretend that the only use Kant makes of the concept is polemical. This requires that the concept be regarded as having at least potential reference or objective reality, and at the point of its introduction into transcendental reflection this possibility is arguably actualised, at least in so far as thoughts of things in themselves are anchored originally in thoughts of the empirically given objects which transcendental reflection proceeds to consider in its special way. Yet by the end of the transcendental story -- at the end of the Transcendental Dialectic -- what we are supposed to have learned, on Allison's account, is that supra-empirical ontological affirmation manifests the error of transcendental realism/illusion, and so the necessity (in some sense) of not regarding the concept of thing in itself as having possible reference. To consider (empirical) things ''apart from the conditions under which we are able to cognise them'' is therefore either to consider nothing at all or to consider actual things as they are not and could not be. Alternatively put, what we must conclude is that all non-polemical talk of things in themselves is just indirect and negatively phrased talk of our cognition and its conditions and objects. This, for better or worse, far from making it anodyne or trivial, seems on the contrary to give something of an ''absolute'' character to Kant's idealism, for it appears to (i) eliminate so much as the possibility of ontological competitors to the reality-status of ''appearances'', and (ii) allow to be dropped the qualification that what transcendental reflection is concerned with is merely human cognition. The hypothesised non-human form of cognition employed at the outset in formulating the discursivity thesis, which allows the suggestion to be derived that a discursive cognition is somehow limited or ''merely finite'', can be discharged at the end of the day: if intellectual intuition were possible, then its objects would be things in themselves, but since no possible objective reality can be accorded to the concept of such objects (to do so would be to relapse into transcendental realism/illusion), the possibility of intellectual intuition collapses in turn. In other words, discursivity now seems to be a characteristic of, and Kantian epistemic conditions to be conditions for, cognition ├╝berhaupt. Allison claims to have retained the dimension of ''humility'' which Langton charges him with having eliminated, while claiming to have shown, contra Langton, that Kantian humility is ''liberating or therapeutic'' rather than ''depressing'' (p. 19). It seems more accurate to say that with therapeutic liberation comes an end to humility, and that what began as the replacement of a ''theocentric'' by an ''anthropocentric'' model of knowledge (as Allison describes Kant's paradigm shift, pp. xv-xvi) comes full circle, in a way that post-Kantian idealism is often held to aim at but which is not generally thought to be Kant's strategy. If Allison is right, therefore, the standard way of contrasting Kantian with post-Kantian idealism is false or at any rate highly misleading (a result that, it should be said, some interpreters of German idealism may approve).

Allison's interpretation has the very considerable strength that it equips transcendental idealism with a unitary, meta-philosophical rationale which gives the doctrine more unity, depth, and originality than metaphysical interpretations, many of which tend instead to make Kant's position seem a highly problematic or downright incoherent compromise between idealistic and realistic, and empiricist and rationalist philosophical forces. Yet for all its brilliance and profundity, I think it remains open to question whether Allison's interpretation lays to rest the traditional ontological reading.