Kant's Conception of Freedom: A Developmental and Critical Analysis

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Henry E. Allison, Kant's Conception of Freedom: A Developmental and Critical Analysis, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 531pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107145115.

Reviewed by Allen Wood, Indiana University, Bloomington


The title of this hefty book might easily mislead. The book is in effect a detailed survey of Kant's entire philosophy, including even many Reflexionen from Kant's Nachlass, as seen from the standpoint of one of its leading scholars of the past half century. It encompasses the development of Kant's philosophy from Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755) all the way to Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793-94) and even Metaphysics of Morals (1798). The book's ten chapters divide evenly between Kant's writings before the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) and his writings after that. It is sometimes evident that Henry E. Allison is reading the early writings as preparatory to his interpretation of the works for which Kant is much better known. But since Allison himself thinks Kant's mature views about freedom developed relatively late, and that the crucial turn came only between 1785 and 1788, it is hard to resist the conclusion that in the first 230 pages or so Allison is coming to terms with Kant's early writings more as an end in itself rather than a means to understanding Kant's later philosophy.

How can one review such a book? Many ostensible book reviews are really discussions of the topic of the book by someone other than the book's author. Such reviews are sometimes interesting and informative, even if they are mainly a display of the reviewer's thoughts. But I have always thought that the first duty of a review is to inform its readers about the contents of the book. Criticisms are valuable, if informed and economically argued, because you can learn something about a book's contents by seeing how they might be challenged. I have for many years agreed with much in Allison's reading of Kant but also disagreed with a fair amount of it. Below I will criticize his views, mainly those in the second half of the book, hoping that even my criticisms will inform more than merely judge.

Chapter 1 deals with writings produced between 1755 and 1759. The first of these is Universal Natural History, now best known because it proposed the nebular hypothesis of the origin of the solar system, and explained its origin and motions in generally Newtonian terms but, unlike Newton, without any appeal to divine design. Like this work itself, Allison's discussion says nothing explicitly about free will. It focuses on the place of rational beings, and especially human beings on earth, in Kant's highly speculative cosmology. There follows a fairly detailed discussion of Kant's first treatise on metaphysics, the Latin essay whose short title is Nova dilucidatio (1755). Allison discusses Kant's treatment of the relation of logic to metaphysics, the first version of his so-called "possibility" proof for God's existence, and then his critical discussion of the views of Wolff and Crusius on freedom of the will. We get Allison's fairly detailed expositions of their positions as well as Kant's reactions to them. In a short dialogue, which was part of Nova dilucidatio, Kant portrays a Wolffian compatibilist named Caius defeating a Crusian incompatibilist named Titus. Chapter 1 ends with Allison's discussion of Kant's essay on optimism (1755) and several Reflexionen on this subject from the late 1750s.

Chapter 2 deals with Kant's metaphysical views in the early 1760s, including his Prize Essay (published 1764), the essay on Negative Magnitudes (1764) and the Only Possible Ground of Proof for a Demonstration of God's Existence (1763). The Prize Essay contains a methodological attack on the synthetic method in metaphysics practiced by the Wolffians. Kant's introduction of the concept of negative magnitudes and the distinction between logical and real possibility represents a development that came to fruition in the Beweisgrund essay, of which Allison gives us an admirably detailed and critical 17-page discussion. He points out the ways this essay still adheres, in its treatment of the divine will, to Wolffian compatibilism in contrast to Crusius' defense of the liberty of indifference. The chapter ends with a discussion of Baumgarten's views on freedom of the will and Kant's treatment of them in his metaphysics lectures of 1764. Kant here defends the idea that true freedom and virtue consists in a harmony between reason and sensible desire rather than the Stoic disparagement of the sensual.

Chapter 3 turns attention to Kant's moral philosophy in the same period. In the Prize Essay, Kant was drawn to the moral sense theory of Hutcheson. Allison here expounds Hutcheson, and the version of Hutcheson to which Kant was attracted, as a form of metaethical 'non-cognitivism'. This offers us a now familiar reading of philosophers like Hutcheson and Hume, but I can't resist the temptation to interject that it seems to me an anachronistic way to read Scottish moral sense theory which does these philosophers no favors. Allison perceptively notes, however, that Kant was never fully committed to Hutcheson's views. He resisted them from the start on the ground that they provide no satisfactory account of the notion of obligation, which Kant, along with Baumgarten, regarded as the fundamental concept needed in moral philosophy. Allison proceeds to an informative discussion of Kant's lectures on ethics of 1765-66, which includes some detailed exposition of both Hutcheson and Baumgarten as well as Kant's critical reflections on them. The chapter concludes with an account of the moral philosophy contained in his published treatise Observations on the Beautiful and Sublime (1766). Allison observes here "it is easy to see that his position is an unstable halfway-house" which again can offer no satisfactory account of obligation because feeling "lacks the requisite normative force" (121).

In Chapter 4 Allison addresses Kant's encounter with the works of Rousseau in the late 1760s and the radical change in his moral philosophy it produced. It begins with a discussion of Kant's (unpublished) Remarks on the Beautiful and Sublime. There is a 30-page exposition and discussion of Rousseau's views on freedom in Émile, and on free will in "Confession of Faith by A Savoyard Vicar" in that work, and of Kant's reactions to them in the Remarks. There is a shorter section on Dreams of a Spirit Seer (1766). Allison admits that this work has little to say directly about free will, but he argues that we can discern by implication that Rousseau had an impact on this work too. Given how enigmatic the Dreams is, a reader (or at least this one) remains skeptical about this. But the upshot of this chapter, which is convincing, is Allison's argument that it is during this period that Kant breaks with Wolffian compatibilism. Allison traces to Rousseau the central Kantian ideas that freedom of the will is closely bound up both with self-consciousness and moral virtue as self-mastery.

Chapter 5 is devoted to the 1770s, which Allison, using the common phrase for it, calls the "Silent Decade," in which Kant published very little. It begins with Kant's remark that 1769 gave him "great light." Allison understands this as Kant's coming to reject the Leibnizian and Wolffian view that sense and understanding differ only in degree of clarity, replacing it with the now familiar Kantian idea that they are separate faculties that must co-operate in all thought and cognition. This soon led Kant to the distinction between a sensible and an intelligible world -- or better put, to conceiving of the world as both sensible and intelligible. Allison thus understands this distinction (correctly in my view) as conceptual rather than metaphysical. It does not designate two different realms of objects (one of which is claimed to exist but to be mysteriously beyond our ken) but rather distinguishes between the faculty that intuits and the faculty that thinks. Allison provides a relatively brief discussion of Kant's 1770 Inaugural Dissertation. This is followed by a roughly 40-page discussion of Reflexionen on freedom from the 1770s and a 10-page discussion of the Collins lectures on moral philosophy dating from the late 1770s. It is difficult to summarize this chapter because it consists largely of a series of remarks about a series of short reflections. However, toward the end of the chapter, Allison summarizes the result by saying that "by the end of the 'Silent Decade' Kant had arrived at the view that both the theoretical and the practical use of reason required an appeal to at least the conception of freedom in the transcendental sense" -- that is, freedom as a capacity to cause a state or series of states von selbst, and not grounded on a prior natural cause. This, Allison concludes, "was also essentially the view that he held in the first Critique" (233).

Chapter 6 finally brings us to that work, and it begins Allison's discussion of the views on freedom for which Kant is best known. We are given a 15-page exposition of the Third Antinomy, followed by an account of how Allison thinks the problem of freedom relates to transcendental idealism. Then Allison attempts to define the problem of freedom as Kant saw it in the first Critique, followed by a sketch (Schattenriss) of Kant's solution. I agree with much of what Allison says here, in particular with his claims that "by things in themselves Kant understands things considered in abstraction from the temporal relations in which they stand" (254) and that Kant's account "neither claims that there are any putatively intelligible causes nor, if there were, how they are to be conceived." (265). He acknowledges that the term "transcendental cause" "seems to suggest a mysterious noumenal power;" and I think Allison is right to suggest that the term should be taken to refer to a "transcendental concept of a cause rather than, as usually assumed, a metaphysically distinct noumenal entity" (280). I am not in full agreement with everything Allison says here, but I do agree with his conclusion that Kant's aim is to establish no more than the logical compatibility of freedom and natural determinism.

Allison then discusses the often overlooked mention of freedom in the Canon of Pure Reason, where Kant claims that practical freedom is knowable empirically, and argues that the metaphysical problem of freedom is one of transcendent metaphysics, whose resolution (or rather, whose dismissal as beyond our powers to solve) should have no effect on our empirical judgments of imputability. Here and throughout the rest of the book, Allison quarrels with what I regard as Kant's entirely sensible view the Canon expresses on this score. Disappointingly (to me), Allison tries to revive the notion that Kant requires a metaphysical explanation of freedom in order to satisfy the demands of practical reason. However, Allison also discusses the conception of the moral incentive in the Canon, which is different from the one Kant presented in the Groundwork and afterward. Here I think Allison successfully corrects some errors about this part of the Critique that are found in his 2011 commentary on the Groundwork. Specifically, he sees that Kant's argument there for faith in God and a moral world concerns solely the nature of the rational incentives of morality, and not worries about the strength of moral motivation based on our moral weakness.

Chapter 7 is about the Groundwork and its treatment of the concepts of freedom and autonomy. He perceptively begins by discussing Kant's argument for freedom as a presupposition of both theoretical and practical reason that he presented in his review of Schulz. Allison's discussion of the Groundwork, especially of the notoriously difficult Third Section, is long and complex. I won't attempt to summarize Allison's argument, in part because the complexity resists summary and in part because I do not understand it. Let me be candid here. I use this phrase in precisely that technical sense in which one philosopher says he does not understand something another philosopher says when what he really means is that he thinks the other philosopher's views are utterly wrongheaded. Allison belongs to that fairly sizable club of Kant interpreters (of which I am definitely not a member) who think the deduction of freedom and the moral law in the Groundwork was both a failure and that Kant eventually realized this, and who then think Kant rescued his position only in the second Critique with his introduction of the famous 'fact of reason'. I doubt that any philosopher's wrestling match with the problem of freedom (whatever position on that problem the philosopher may want to defend) will ever result in complete victory for the philosopher. Kant's wisest claim here is that "freedom can never be comprehended, nor can insight into it ever be gained" (Groundwork 4:459). But I see no evidence that Kant ever admitted the Groundwork's arguments were a failure, or that the second Critique offers a different account that improves on them.

Most who consider them a failure do so because they think he is committed there to an extravagantly metaphysical version of transcendental idealism as part of his argument. Allison avoids this error (for reasons I've already hinted at above), so his diagnosis of Kant's alleged failure must be different. One charge Allison makes is that Kant's argument is viciously circular -- which echoes Kant's own statements at Groundwork 4:450-452; but of course on the following page Kant argues that this appearance of circularity is a false one which he has removed. So the charge of circularity cannot be one we have evidence Kant accepted. The other way Allison criticizes Kant's argument is by saying it claims only that reason can be practical and not that pure reason can be. But Kant explicitly equates these two questions at Groundwork 4:461. It is true that Kant denies that either proposition can be given an explanation, since we can form no metaphysical concept of it or claim any insight into its real possibility. The most we can hope to achieve is an understanding of why freedom and morality are incomprehensible to us (Groundwork 4:465). But Kant consistently maintains that freedom must nevertheless be presupposed as a condition of both theoretical and practical reason. Allison's tortuous argument in this chapter is throughout designed (though in my view often through misunderstandings and distortions) to pave the way for his treatment of the problem of freedom in the second Critique. Between 1785 and 1788, according to Allison, Kant's views on freedom and reason underwent a radical change -- what Karl Ameriks has called "the great reversal" -- so that the second Critique gives us -- in the form of the "fact of reason" -- the deduction of both freedom and the moral law that the Groundwork so conspicuously failed to provide.

This takes us to Chapter 8, fully sixty pages in length, which also resists summary, because it contains wide-ranging observations about Kant's moral philosophy and moral psychology, as well as (or as part of) his account of how the 'fact of reason' provides the needed deduction of the moral law. One thing I find curious here is that although Kant's argument in the Third Section of the Groundwork may in fact have been a failure, there is no direct evidence whatever that Kant himself ever thought this. On the contrary, in the Preface to the second Critique, he writes that the present work: "presupposes, indeed, the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, but only insofar as this constitutes preliminary acquaintance with the principle of duty and provides and justifies a determinate formula of it" (Critique of Practical Reason 5:8). As Allison himself notes, this directly echoes the Groundwork itself, whose aim was to "search for and establish the supreme principle of morality" (Groundwork 4:392). The search provided and the establishment (deduction) justified the system of formulas of the moral law we find in the Groundwork, especially the formula of autonomy, which is the one given at Critique of Practical Reason 5:30, where the 'fact of reason' is introduced. What the Preface to the second Critique says is simply that this work accepts the results of the Groundwork on both these points. Perhaps surprisingly, Allison does not even directly dispute this. Instead he shifts his ground. Instead of claiming that the second Critique repudiates the deduction of the Groundwork, he claims that the two works had different aims. "The task of the second Critique is primarily systematic in nature and involves establishing the unity of reason" (352).

A second thing I find curious about the "great reversal" club is that its members suddenly scatter when it comes to saying what the mysterious "fact of reason" is, or how it succeeds where the Groundwork failed. Each of them seems to have his or her own story to tell about 'fact of reason'. Some of these stories are interesting, but none of them seem to me to show that there has been any "great reversal" in Kant's thinking between 1785 and 1788. In Allison's case, the claim is that it does so by establishing "the unity of reason." But did the Groundwork deny the "unity of reason"? On the contrary, its argument depended on the fact that we cannot self-consistently regard our judgments (theoretical or practical) as predetermined by alien causes (Groundwork 4: 448). This was his response to the worry, repeated throughout the Groundwork, that morality itself might be merely a "cobweb of the brain." And in any case how is the bold (or even brazen) assertion that the moral law is a "fact of reason" supposed to remove these worries if the argument of the Groundwork did not?

Let me briefly, and as a confirmed outsider to the "great reversal" club, offer my own thoughts about "the fact of reason," which follow a suggestion made to me by Marilia Espirito Santo: Any deduction in Kant aims at justifying our claim to something of which we are already in possession. In the first Critique, this was the categories, which we use both in common sense and science; in the Groundwork it was freedom, which we take for granted in our use of reason (whether theoretical or practical), and the moral law, which Kant argued is co-implied by freedom. But a Kantian deduction is always a deduction only of the real possibility of that which it justifies. To achieve actual cognition through the categories, we also need empirical intuition. There is, of course, no empirical intuition of the moral law; but there is an awareness of actual obligation in a particular case, the act by which our own reason imposes the obligation on ourselves. This act, as I see it, is what Kant means when he uses the term Faktum der Vernunft. It is self-authenticating, but only if a deduction of its real possibility has already been provided (namely, that given in the Third Section of the Groundwork, which, as we have seen, Kant says explicitly that he is presupposing in the second Critique). Appeal to the "fact of reason" therefore cannot offer, and is not intended by Kant to offer, any new deduction or justification of either freedom or the moral law. To someone who rejects the argument of the Groundwork, appealing to "the fact of reason" in response to moral skepticism would be, in a phrase Allison quotes from me (but I was merely quoting it from Paul Guyer), only so much "moralistic bluster."

Chapter 9 is about the third Critique. It is not directly about the issue of free will at all, but about the way that work attempts to provide a transition from nature to freedom, or from theoretical to practical reason. It contains thoughtful reflections on the difficult task of explaining how aesthetic and biological purposiveness can effect a transition from nature to freedom. Allison also has worthwhile things to say about the interest (both empirical and intellectual) that we take in the beautiful. And he also provides an exposition of Kant's unique presentation of his ethical theory in the Methodology of the third Critique, arguing for the unity of natural and moral purposiveness through representation of the human being as the ultimate end of nature and the culture of discipline as that about the human being which makes humanity such an end.

The final Chapter 10 is titled "Kant's Final Thoughts about Freedom." Roughly the first third of it is devoted to replying to the objection, first presented by Reinhold and later (more famously) by Sidgwick, that Kant's conception of freedom is both ambiguous and untenable because it commits him to the position that only our dutiful acts are imputable, while violations of duty are subject to natural necessity and we can't be held responsible for them. This discussion may be of interest to readers who take these objections more seriously than I do, since I think they arise from quite elementary misunderstandings of Kant's views on freedom and imputability. The misunderstandings are perhaps understandable misreadings of some things Kant says in the Third Section of the Groundwork -- the same errors that often lead even those sympathetic to Kant to conclude that the argument of that section is a failure. Allison correctly locates the error as resulting from preoccupation with metaphysical issues which Kant consistently declares to be moot. Allison here insightfully observes that if Sidgwick's interpretation of Kant were correct, then it would imply that no acts, neither good nor evil ones, could be imputed to us.

Most of Chapter 10 is devoted to a discussion of Kant's thesis of radical evil, presented in Part One of Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. Allison is one of those who thinks this thesis is (in his words) "philosophical, or equivalently, conceptual," and that "the demonstration of a universal propensity to evil, at least as Kant construes it, is a relatively trivial result" (492). It is astonishing to me that anyone could regard as a "trivial," merely "conceptual" truth that all human beings without exception have a radical, innate and inextirpable propensity to place the rationally inferior incentives of inclination or self-love ahead of the rationally supreme incentive of morality. Goethe was shocked and outraged at the thought that Kant endorsed such a gloomy, backward and misanthropic view. Allison, however, can barely manage a yawn.

It is an error to extract the thesis of radical evil from its context in the Religion, where Kant is plainly engaged in the task of producing a version of the Christian doctrine of original sin that can be offered to reason as an acceptable interpretation of it. Kant is clearly not fully committed to that doctrine, since in the Religion he proposes to contrast it with the modern (or "heroic") view that humanity is morally progressing. Kant's own position on these opposed positions is not one of unconditional commitment to either side. In the final paragraph of the Anthropology, which is later than the Religion, Kant seems to favor the modern "heroic" position. No account of Kant on radical evil is defensible if it cannot accommodate the fact that Kant is not fully committed to the thesis of radical evil. Thus any position that seeks to find, either in Kant or independently of him, some sort of conceptual or transcendental proof of the thesis must be a non-starter -- at least as an interpretation of Kant.

In contrast to his earlier writings on this topic, Allison now seems to concede that Kant regards the thesis as empirical, and he even accepts the claim, first made by Sharon Anderson-Gold and then argued in more detail by myself, that radical evil is to be identified with the empirical human propensity to competitiveness or "unsociable sociability." Kant was clear that moral philosophy has empirical "anthropological" presuppositions as well as an a priori moral principle. He did not confuse the two. Allison himself seems to admit this -- from time to time -- when he speaks of "Kant's unflattering view of human nature" (431); but is this view, not shared by Schiller, Goethe or Herder, then merely a conceptual claim?

Allison insists that there is "a distinction of level" to be drawn between the empirical manifestations of radical evil and the basically conceptual nature of it. As I see it, the basic issue should be whether, how far and for what purposes Kant accepts the thesis of radical evil at all. Allison's interpretation of it commits him to the position that Kant is fully committed to the thesis on a priori grounds, which Allison seeks variously in the conditions of imputability, in Kant's defense of "rigorism" (against "latitudinarianism") and in the very concept of obligation as self-constraint. Perhaps Allison, in direct defiance of Kant, can make out these "conceptual" arguments for the thesis of radical evil (though I doubt it). But Kant explicitly says that the thesis might be proven "later on" by "anthropological research" (Religion 6:25); it cannot be used by "moral dogmatics" but only for the purposes of "moral discipline" (Religion 6:50-51). In other words, Kant explicitly regards the thesis that human nature contains a radical propensity to evil as a morally useful but still unproven empirical claim.

So now I have once again aired my longstanding disagreements with Allison as far as I felt it suitable to air them in a book review. But let me now try to sum up my assessment of this huge book, considered as a whole. Just yesterday I was talking with a prospective philosophy graduate student who has a strong interest in Kant but only limited acquaintance with his writings, and desires to acquire the expertise he will need to become a serious Kant scholar. What I told him was this: You need to start reading through Kant's works, perhaps in chronological order, at least what is offered in English in the Cambridge edition. But you may also need to accompany this with an informed and philosophically acute account of what you are reading. Is there such a thing, all in one place? I told him Henry Allison's brand new book is what I would recommend. Even where I think it is wrong, what you will get is an expert view argued by someone who has spent his life studying these texts and now shares with us the cumulative results of that study. I know of no other book that does this with the breathtaking scope of this one. In the world of Kant studies, this book may be almost as irreplaceable as its author.