Kant's Inferentialism: The Case Against Hume

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David Landy, Kant's Inferentialism: The Case Against Hume, Routledge, 2015, 308pp., $49.95, ISBN 9781138062795.

Reviewed by Timothy Rosenkoetter, Dartmouth College


The interpretation on offer in this ambitious work is an attempt to build upon the insight that "Kant's theory is of a piece with Hume's: they are both theories according to which complex states of affairs are represented as such by forming pictures of such states of affairs" (107), pictures that Kant calls "intuitions." Moreover, Kant, in insisting against Hume that there is a species of representation that is categorically different from images, is not proposing a wholly independent mode of representation, as one finds in the classical rationalists. Instead, Kant conceives of the ability of concepts to represent as parasitic on the representational power of intuitions. While intuitions represent objects, "what a concept represents is not an object but the relations of the objects represented by intuitions" (75). Concepts are "a special kind of meta-representation" (183).

Given the starting point that he shares with Hume, why doesn't Kant just follow Hume and make do with intuitions alone? One of David Landy's many intriguing suggestions is that Kant introduces concepts because he realizes that Hume's account of how pictures represent cannot work. Kant enlists concepts in order to realize the true promise of the image-centered starting point. That is Kant's broad rationale for introducing concepts, according to Landy. In more detail: first, Hume held that an impression or idea of a triangle is of a triangle because the representation itself is triangular. Similarly, a perception can be of a time because the perception itself takes time to occur (Treatise, Bk. I, Pt. 2). Stated generally,

'a'R'b' represents xRy.

Second, Landy argues this proposal cannot explain how an imagistic representation can have determinate representational content. A mental picture of two differently sized triangles alongside one another could just as well be of their congruence as of the fact that one is larger than the other. Third, Kant correctly diagnoses this problem, according to Landy, and offers counterpart relations (as Sellars will later term them) that are sufficiently rich to specify a unique representational content for each intuition:

'a'R*'b' represents xRy.

Inferential relations serve as these counterpart relations, i.e., as instances of R*. It is as conceptualized that intuitions are complex representations of complex states of affairs. Inferential relations assume a central role in Landy's account because "a concept, by its very nature, is an interjudgmental function of unity of intuitions" (76). In particular, in predicating a concept of an intuition, <i is F>,[1] one is thereby licensing non-analytic ("material") inferences to other judgments that contain the same intuition (<i is G>, where <F> does not contain <G>, or vice-versa) -- and perhaps also requiring and forbidding yet other material inferences (66; cf. 69, 182). At least at the schematic level this is a philosophically rich proposal, which will be of tremendous importance if it can be filled out and shown to be correct -- or even just on the right track.

The book is laid out so that Chapter 1 contains the Humean background, much of which is not absolutely necessary for those interested in Landy's take on Kant. Chapters 2-4 are devoted to filling out the core of the inferentialist reading of Kant. They also feature a proposal for how sensations are synthesized to yield intuitions. This portion of the book is largely self-sufficient. The concluding chapters enrich that core proposal with a reading of the Analogies of Experience as central to a scientific realism regarding theoretical entities (Ch. 5), an inferentialist interpretation of Kant's theory of the self (Ch. 6), and a proposal for how to understand transcendental idealism (Postscript). Each of these concluding chapters presents inferentialism as the key to resolving a long-standing problem in Kant interpretation. I lack the space to engage with anything more than the absolute core of Landy's complex proposal. In what follows I must also ignore what will be one of the most salient features of the book for many readers, namely, the strong claims that Landy makes for Hume's direct influence on Kant. Landy argues that Kant had a subtle grasp of Hume's positions and why they fail, and that this grasp played a role in his development of an inferentialist theory of concepts. Even readers who concur regarding a strong Humean influence will bristle at some of Landy's specific suggestions. Without doing anything to settle this matter here, I'll just caution against dismissing Landy's substantive interpretation just because he overreaches in some claims of direct influence (if he does).

There can be no doubt that Kant attached great importance to the fact that any concept can be used inferentially. By itself, however, this is consistent with a model of concepts that takes their mode of representation to be broadly similar to the way in which intuitions represent: while intuitions represent objects, concepts represent abstract universals (cf. 75). In part, Landy finds evidence for Kant's rejection of this model in passages telling us that our ability to construe an imagistic representation as an F depends on "rules." In a passage from the first Critique we learn that "we think of a triangle as an object by being conscious of the composition of three straight lines in accordance with a rule according to which such an intuition can always be exhibited" (A105). Landy reads this as an allusion to material inference rules, explaining that "the concept 'triangle' would license the inference from 'This line segment is part of a triangle' to 'There are line segments that intersect each of the ends of this line segment that also intersect each other,'" among many others (140; cf. 77). Though Landy doesn't frame matters in this way, he is thereby offering a reductive proposal on Kant's behalf: in order to construe an image as an F it is necessary and sufficient to possess a set of rules (in addition to the image itself, of course). Which rules? Not merely those that make up <triangle> by being its constituent marks (e.g., <closed figure>). What we need to grasp are permissions, requirements, and prohibitions that cannot simply be analytically inferred from <triangle>. Once we possess these, however, we have everything required in order to construe an image as of a triangle.[2]

We do well to contrast Landy's proposal with a plausible non-reductive alternative, which he does not discuss. What makes it non-reductive is the insistence that rules alone -- of whatever kind, however multitudinous -- are not enough to enable us to construe an image as of a determinate kind. This is why Kant deems it necessary to add the power of judgment (Urteilskraft), alongside understanding (Verstand), to the list of our basic capacities. What the power of judgment enables us to do is to see whether this or that case is correctly subsumed under a rule, an ability that is related to intuitions because they are the epistemic medium through which we have access to any "this." In order to interpret intuitions as instances of a rule we need the power of judgment, which is precisely not reducible to understanding ("the faculty of rules," A126).

Once these two proposals are clearly delineated and contrasted, it is difficult, I think, to make a responsible interpretative case for Landy's reductive alternative. Consider first Kant's belief that there are physicians, judges, and statesmen who grasp an adequate stock of "rules" but lack a sufficiently well-developed power of judgment to use them. They understand "the universal in abstracto but cannot distinguish whether a case in concreto belongs under it . . . " (A134/B173). Kant's whole point in this discussion is to deny that their cognitive deficit can be made good through the acquisition of more rules. Landy could suggest that what Kant is really getting at is a distinction between two different sets of rules: (a) the rules that are equivalent to the marks of the concept itself, and (b) an indeterminately large number of material inferences, which are not analytically contained in the concept. One reason this suggestion is implausible is that Kant had at his disposal language that would have made this point clearly ("teach the statesman synthetic rules!"), but he chose instead to appeal to schemata and the power of judgment, while explicitly denying that these are reducible to the faculty of rules.

One might question my suggestion that Landy's account is reductive. After all, in order to construe an image as an F a subject does need to possess an image, and that is more than just possessing a set of rules. What this response misses is that the power of judgment is not the simple sum of sensibility and understanding. In other terms, one does not possess a schema simply by dint of having an image plus a concept (or any set of "conceptual necessities" equivalent to the latter [182]). However, let's forget this worry for the moment and simply grant that possessing a set of material inferences is sufficient for intuiting a triangle, so long as one also has an appropriate imagistic representation. In this case a new challenge arises. How can this account be made to cohere with Kant's views on the need for diagrammatic reasoning within mathematics?

I take Kant to hold that synthetic truths about triangles can be justified only because we have epistemic access to intuitions that represent triangles by virtue of our grasp of the schema for <triangle>, which grasp is an actualization of the power of judgment (cf. A135/B174f). It would seem that on Landy's account, by contrast, an intuition, <i>, that might otherwise represent various other things is an intuition of a triangle if and only if one takes a particular set of material inferences involving <i> to be permitted, required, or forbidden. Yet since these inferences are synthetic, mathematical reasoning on this model is more accurately represented as an analytic argument from a set of synthetic premises. Perhaps we find it psychologically necessary to consult images in the course of mathematical reasoning, but diagrammatic reasoning (which Kant clearly takes to be reducible neither to mere sensibility nor to our facility with rules) isn't doing any justificatory work on this account. I doubt that Landy's inferentialism can yield a plausible interpretation of Kant's views on mathematical cognition. Even so, it would be interesting to see an attempt to work out the model in detail, and this should be considered a key test for any inferentialist project such as Landy's. As it is, Landy devotes no real attention to how his reading can be made to cohere with Kant's views on mathematics.

Thus far I have focused on how concepts relate to intuitions. Kant's Inferentialism features an entire additional layer, in which inferential rules (i.e., concepts) guide an imaginative synthesis that converts sensations into intuitions. The presentation of this account centers on an inferentialist version of "Pippin's problem": this synthesis cannot have an inferential structure, since sensations are not the right sort of thing to figure as the relata in inferences (cf. 147). Landy's resolution of the problem is to hold that this perceptual synthesis is "blind," namely "rule governed" without being "rule following" (145):

Concepts-qua-inferential-rules create a certain structure among the judgments that they relate; the imagination imposes this same structure on sensations to form intuitions. It does not do so by forming judgments about sensations but rather by forming full-fledged conceptual intuitions, the structure of which is modeled on that of concepts-qua-inferential-rules. It neither merely conforms to these rules nor obeys them in its activity. Rather, it instantiates these rules: unites sensations in a way that models these rules, and does so because of those rules, but without representing either the rules or the sensations to itself as such. (153)

I find Landy's ideas regarding the blindness of this synthesis plausible and at points illuminating, but I don't see how his overall proposal solves the putative problem. If it makes sense for a manifold of sensations to instantiate "the same structure" that is found in a set of inferences, then what was the problem in the first place? And if there is a genuine problem about how sensations can provide justification rather than just causal influence, how can it be solved simply by noting that in some cases we instantiate rules without consciously following them? That said, those working in this area will certainly wish to consult the details of Landy's proposal.

I'll close with an observation on method. While reading through Kant's Inferentialism I was excited to find an unfamiliar Reflexion that is offered in support of the book's fundamental contention that Kant appeals to counterpart relations in order to account for representational power of intuitions. In arguing against G.F. Meier's contention that representations are mental pictures, Kant offers several striking counterexamples, one of which is musical notation, in which spatial relations between notes on a stave represent the musical relations between tones. By way of a general lesson Kant suggests that "since the representation borrows its ground from the represented thing, it agrees with the latter in that it is composed out of its partial concepts in the same way that the whole represented thing is composed out of its parts" (R. 1676, Ak. 16:78). Though it's far from clear that partial concepts bear material inferential relations to their whole concept, we can at least presume that the relation is going to be conceptual. Accordingly, Landy takes the note to capture Kant's counterpart theory of pictorial representation "in a nutshell" (65) and refers back to it periodically.

Looking closer, though, I was disappointed to find that R. 1676 provides precious little evidence for the counterpart model. First, Landy doesn't tell his readers that this note has been dated from the b-period (1753-59). Though by itself this would recommend plenty of caution when drawing conclusions regarding Kant's mature position, this isn't the end of the difficulties. There is every reason to think, namely, that at this point in his development Kant still adheres to the intellectualist position that Meier himself holds, according to which all representation is at base conceptual, so that apparently imagistic representations are really just indistinctly represented concepts. Consequently, it is entirely possible that this note is chiding Meier, who frequently explains representation by analogy with pictures,[3] for being a faint-hearted intellectualist[4] -- worlds away from using inferential relations to realize the true potential of an image-centered, Humean starting point! This isn't the only possibility. Kant seems also (or perhaps instead) to be concerned to point out that Meier's appeal to spatially extended pictures is inconsistent with the simplicity and non-spatiality of the soul. The point is that more work needs to be done to establish what Kant was really getting at, and that work will involve considering some possibilities other than Kant espousing a strong form of inferentialism. This is a particularly egregious case of something that I found at many points in the book. It features many evocative passages that might be pointing to some important role for inference. What is often needed is more patient analysis of those passages, supported by a more precise and rigorous specification of positions, inferentialist and otherwise, that Kant might be taking.

In comparison to this rather negative judgment regarding the book's achievements with respect to its main aim, I can report many positive experiences reading isolated portions of the text. The author offers interesting and illuminating analyses of this or that portion of Kant's project, and he often explains difficult material lucidly. The work is imaginative, and Landy is not afraid to take positions that are unpopular.

[1] Though it will meet with resistance in many quarters, I think Landy is completely correct to hold that intuitions can figure as constituents in judgments (cf. 115). This commitment figures in a logically independent account of how the categories relate to the functions of judgment (116). I lack space to discuss these topics.

[2] Since it is plausible that there could not be just one concept, perhaps concepts other than <triangle> are a condition for the possibility of its meaningfulness. But that's different from identifying the concept itself with a set of inferential permissions, requirements, and prohibitions, as Landy does. Once this step has been taken, questions regarding membership in this set arise. Does it include all of the true material inference rules? If not, what determines which are included? But if the set does include all of these rules, this implies that none of us possesses the concept <triangle> fully, and it suggests a scalar notion of concept possession. In contrast to the many subtle questions of this sort, Kant's view seems to be simple. One possesses <triangle> by virtue of thinking the conjunction of a small number of marks, each of which represents a universal.

[3] R. 1676 accompanies two characteristically laconic sections from Meier's Auszug aus der Vernunftlehre (§§10-11, repr., Ak. 16:76). For more expansive examples of Meier explaining representation by analogy with pictures, see Vol. III of his Metaphysik (Halle, 1757), passim, e.g., §489.

[4] The intellectualist can certainly allow that conceptual representation sometimes has an imagistic phenomenology. Yet for all that images are precisely not paradigm representations. The problem is that when Meier wants to explain representation he leads with its privative form.