Kants Kritik der Praktischen Vernunft: Ein Kommentar

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Giovanni B. Sala, Kants Kritik der Praktischen Vernunft: Ein Kommentar, Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 2004, 379pp, Û49.90 (hbk), ISBN 3534157419

Reviewed by Christian Illies, University of Eindhoven


Giovanni B. Sala's commentary on Kant's Critique of Practical Reason has been written for the use of students. But this book is of limited value; while his comments on Kant's text are mostly helpful and good, Sala's criticism of Kant's ethics is frequently unsatisfying. His pronounced philosophical position, a Neo-Thomism that is heavily influenced by Bernard Lonergan, is repeatedly an impediment to an adequate evaluation of Kant's thoughts. Against what he announces -- "this commentary aims at interpreting each passage in its relevant context" (p. 12) -- Sala reads Kant too much in the context of his own philosophy.

Kant's Critique of Practical Reason presupposes a lot because it is based upon the results of other works, especially the Groundwork of the Metaphysic of Morals but also the first Critique. Indeed, even the structure of the second Critique mirrors the first. Nonetheless, there are very different problems discussed in the second Critique. It deals with ethical theory, freedom, action theory (the problem of motivation), but also immortality of the soul and God's existence; and in many sections Kant touches several problems at once. Students find it notoriously difficult to understand what exactly is going on in the text. All of this makes it difficult to write a commentary. The commentator must be familiar with quite different fields of philosophy, he must introduce other works by Kant, and he must organize the material in a transparent way.

Fourty-four years ago, Beck responded to this challenge by dividing his commentary into chapters that focus on Kant's answer to specific problems (like "Freedom"); for each problem he looks at several sections of the text at once. This problem-based structure (cf. 1984, p. 69) makes Kant's line of argumentation very clear, but it is also the reason why Beck's otherwise outstanding book is of limited help if the reader wants to understand a particular passage of the second Critique.

Sala's commentary is meant to remedy this shortcoming. The major part of his book follows closely the text of the second Critique and explains it section by section. Sala alternates from short introductions to the chapters of the Critique, to commentaries on individual sections, to "excursuses" in which he critically evaluates Kant's position. (These excursuses are about a quarter of the text and cover problems like: "The idea of autonomy in Kant's ethics" (p.111), "About the priority of the moral law over the concept of good" (p.137), and "About the problem of an ens necessarium" (p. 330).) Sala's book is meant too be placed next to a copy of the Critique of Practical Judgment on the student's desk. The book clearly serves this purpose: it is well written and provides detailed explanations and cross-references; most passages of the second Critique will be clearer to someone who has read Sala's commentary. Thus the separation of comments on Kant's text and critical evaluation of Kant's arguments (in the excurses) is helpful. (Yet Sala does not always stick to his own distinction; there are often evaluations with the commentaries, especially when Sala dwells upon the formalism of Kant's ethics, which he rejects so strongly. See for example the comments on section A 59-61; p. 109f.) In addition, the first part of the book gives an introduction to the historical development of Kant's ethical thoughts. Sala emphasizes the strong continuity of Kant with moral philosophy of his time, in particular with Wolff and Crusius, and sees it as essentially pre-critical (p. 42). It is one of the central points of Sala's interpretation that the "core of the second Critique is independent of transcendental idealism" (p.13). The book ends with a very short chapter on the impact of Kant's ethics on philosophy.

Throughout the whole book, and especially in the excursuses, Sala is willing to take a strong view on Kant's ethics and to look at it from a perspective that is rather unusual among Kant scholars. As a result, he refers to neglected problems, which, when looked at in more detail surely prove useful for current debates. For example, many philosophers consider Kant's idea of moral obligation as too strong, but according to Sala the problem is that it is too weak. Autonomous self-determination can never lead to any categorical or absolute obligation since, as Sala argues, a "contingent being" is not able to establish an "unconditioned demand" (p. 113). His point is that we are always able to change our freely self-imposed obligations and that this undermines their authority:

Because under the hypothesis that there are merely duties that a human gives to himself, an alleged duty that is withdrawn is no longer a duty. It is therefore impossible to disobey it [i.e. a self-imposed duty] (p. 113).

Although Kant would object that we are not free in this sense to change what we consider to be our duty, since we are bound by reason, there is still a fundamental difficulty. On the one hand, Kant seems to look at reason as a subjective faculty, as our way of reasoning. On the other hand, he sees reason as finding objective, that is subject-transcending, theoretical and practical truths.

Yet this discussion also shows the most obvious shortcoming of Sala's commentary: He neglects most debates and literature outside his tradition. It seems quite plausible that the problem of reason's power to bind humans requires a discussion of philosophers like Fichte and Hegel (who tried to solve Kant's problem by replacing human reason with an absolute reason), and of continental and analytic philosophers who interpret reasoning as a inter-subjective process (K.-O. Apel, J. Habermas, and O. O'Neill). Sala ignores most of these discussions; Apel and Habermas are dealt with only briefly in the last chapter (p. 356f.), and O'Neill and the analytic tradition of Kant scholarship is completely absent from his book. We only find a single remark: Sala writes that people like Henry Allison, Paul Guyer, Jerome Schneewind, and Allen Wood have a high level of argumentation, but are not close to enough to Kant's text to be considered further (p. 358). Their works are therefore never referred to.

But what is possibly worse: The strong presence of Sala's own ethical theory sometimes darkens Kant's arguments rather than illuminating them. To give an example: in Sala's excursus on Kant's notion of freedom (p. 167-170), we are informed about Kant's distinction between "Willkür" and "Wille", and that the latter is a "positive" freedom to act morally. This raises Kant's notorious problem of human freedom to act immorally (see E.L. Fackenheim 1954). Sala remarks:

Indeed, moral evil (malum culpae) is absolutely irrational. Since ens and verum (being and intelligibilia) convertuntur, evil is in its essence a non-ens non-intelligible. As such it excludes the possibility of being understood, exactly because it does not have anything intelligible about it. Of it […] no explanation is possible (p. 170)

With this remark, Sala argues in line with Augustine and Thomas Aquinas that we can act against our better judgment, and that this choice cannot be made intelligible exactly because it is against reason. But that is rather unsatisfying as an evaluation or explanation of Kant's account of immoral actions. For a start, it obscures the fact that for Kant the immoral as much as the moral choice is to a certain extent incomprehensible (as Sala himself notes in a different context, p. 211) -- but for a different reason. For Kant the problem is to understand a first choice that determines our general disposition ("Gesinnung", see Rel. p. 25); either we choose to follow moral maxims in our life or we follow immoral maxims (and are "radically evil", as he calls it; Rel. p. 19). Yet this first choice has to be made freely (otherwise we would not be held responsible, see Rel. p. 25) and cannot itself be guided by a maxim (otherwise we would face an unlimited regress of maxims). That makes it difficult to understand the choice at all, whether we choose to follow the good or the bad first maxim. (In addition, Kant says a lot about what evil is at different places. He sees it as a wrong order of maxims, either by giving desires priority out of weakness of the will (M.M. 408, Rel. 29, 37), or by deliberately acting from a mixture of moral and prudential concerns (M.M. 384, 408, Rel. 37). Finally "vice" is introduced as the disposition of someone who deliberately makes it his principle to transgress the moral law whenever it conflicts with desired pleasures (M.M. 390, 405; Rel. 42).)

Here, as much as at other places, Sala's remarks are not likely to make Kant's problems transparent to the reader.

On a more fundamental level, there are two aspects of Sala's overall reading of Kant that are questionable: (1) his tenet that the core of the second Critique is independent of Kant's transcendental idealism, and (2) his systematic thesis (or hope) that Kant's ethics is compatible with the type of Thomist value ethics that Sala holds.

Regarding (1): for his pre-critical interpretation of Kant's ethics, Sala offers two arguments: that there is no transcendental deduction of the categorical imperative but a reference to the Faktum der Vernunft (p. 51, 100), and that Kant has developed the idea of an autonomy-based ethics prior to the first Critique (p.43, 111ff.).

But these arguments are not sufficient. For a start, transcendental deductions (or arguments) are not necessarily linked to transcendental idealism (something that Sala could have learned from Strawson and the analytic discussion). Thus, even if Kant gives up all hope for a transcendental deduction, his discussion of the possibility of practical freedom can only be understood in the framework of transcendental idealism. And Sala's interpretation of the Faktum der Vernunft as an intuitive direct knowledge of moral goods (p. 100 f.) is highly questionable; it would make all of Kant's efforts to identify moral maxims simply superfluous.

The argument that Kant developed most of his ethics prior to his transcendental idealism does not have much force either. After all, Kant wrote the second Critique while he was working at the second edition of the first Critique (as Sala remarks himself, p. 53). Further, the Groundwork already shows his aim to modify his notion of autonomy and to integrate it in his transcendental philosophy. This ongoing process leads to important alterations such as the distinction between Wille and Willkür that are necessary precisely in order to integrate practical and theoretical reason.

Regarding (2): Sala's attempt to harmonize Kant with Thomas Aquinas starts from two objections. The first is a common one: the categorical imperative is an empty formula and not apt to provide substantial moral norms (p. 101-105) (although one might wonder why Sala does not discuss the example of the false promise, the case where the universalizability test might work.) Sala's second objection has already been mentioned: an autonomous subject in Kant's sense will not come to a moral law with categorical authority. Absolute obligation cannot be found internally ("immanent-idealistisch", as Sala argues on p. 73). For Sala, both deficiencies would be remedied if we introduced objective goods as the basis of morality. They would give content to the moral law, explain why the norms are universally binding, and give them their categorical character (p. 137-140):

The possibility […] of taking the object as a motive for the action, because it is morally good, is never considered by Kant. This […] means that the notion of good comes before the particular law and gives it a foundation. (p. 139)

But how could Kant possibly accept Sala's alternative view? It is central to his ethics that we can never start directly from knowing the goodness of some object, much less that a good object could directly motivate us. Motivation of free agents can be analyzed in terms of maxims, and the problem is exactly how to identify moral maxims. To be sure, Kant would agree that a maxim of supporting objective goods is a moral maxim (and the respect we owe to other humans comes close to this). But to say so is not sketching an alternative grounding for ethics or ethical motivation. Rather, it is pointing to the fundamental problem: How do we identify "objective goods"? To put it in simple terms: Kant searches for rational criteria to determine what is good. No reference to any apparent good can be an answer, since it rather obviously begs the question: why should we accept the apparent goodness? Reason asks for justifications. Whatever one thinks about Sala's alternative epistemology (cf. p. 71-73), based upon the human capacity to grasp reality, truth and goodness in some more direct way (ens et verum convertuntur), it is surely too far away from Kant's critical epistemology to be harmonized with his central concern.

As a result, Sala has written a book that is valuable for students and in danger of confusing them profoundly at the same time. Yet if it is used in a critical way, e.g., as a starting point for a dialogue between Kant and a very different ethical tradition, it can serve an important aim for education.


L. W. Beck, A Commentary on Kant's Critique of Practical Reason, Chicago: University of Chicago Press 1960 (reprint Midway 1984).

E.L. Fackenheim, "Kant and Radical Evil", University of Toronto Quarterly 23 (1953-54), pp. 339-353.

All references to Kants gesammelte Schriften (KGS), edited under the auspices of the Königlich Preussische Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1902 - ).

Rel.: Religion innerhalb der Grenzen der reinen Vernunft (1793, KGS VI).