Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft. Die Grundlegung der modernen Philosophie

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Otfried Hoeffe, Kants Kritik der reinen Vernunft. Die Grundlegung der modernen Philosophie, C. H. Beck, 2003, 378pp, € 24.90 (hbk), ISBN 3406509193.

Reviewed by Falk Wunderlich, University of Notre Dame


Ottfried Hoeffe’s book has two major purposes. In the first place, it is intended as a systematic commentary on Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. The second key intention of the book is to argue for Kant’s significance in a variety of modern debates.

The commentary is systematic in the sense that the author is not giving close textual analysis at large, but he is commenting on sets of important problems. Parts 1 to 5 of the book follow the key parts of the Critique, representing the introductions and forewords (part 1), the transcendental aesthetic (part 2), metaphysical and transcendental deduction, and schematism (part 3), the analytic of principles (part 4), paralogisms and antinomies (part 5). Part 6 deals with the doctrine of method and contains a general conclusion; in addition, it contains an overview of the metaphors Kant uses.

The first Critique is for Hoeffe by far the most important work in modern philosophy. According to him, many of Kant’s insights in the Critique anticipate views usually seen as innovations of the 20th century. Correspondingly, Hoeffe regrets that the contributions Kant made (or the contributions which could be made from a Kantian point of view) are not sufficiently taken into account in many contemporary philosophical debates. So the general attitude of the book is to argue that the Critique of Pure Reason offers solutions for a variety of contemporary philosophical problems. Hoeffe is dealing, on the one hand, with modern objections against Kant, and, on the other hand, he presents a Kantian point of view to contemporary debates where Kant is not explicitly referred to. In particular, Hoeffe deals with: objections against the distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments (61-65), the analytical foundation of mathematics (99-106), the theory of truth (158-164), epistemological naturalism (165-7), the question how far Kant’s foundation of science is bound to the sciences of his time (201-9), the body-mind-problem (230-4), Davidson’s anomalous monism (235-8), Plantinga’s version of the ontological argument (265-7), positivism (277-281), and the question whether Kant’s theory is a version of solipsism (337-342). I will focus on the debate about synthetic and analytic judgments, the theory of truth, and the body-mind-problem.

(1) Kant famously distinguishes between analytic and synthetic judgments as well as between judgments a priori and a posteriori. These distinctions have often been found problematic. Hoeffe deals with objections raised by Kripke and Quine. According to Kripke’s causal theory of reference, objects are given names in an initial act which remain unchanged afterwards. Therefore, identity assertions (like “the Evening Star is the Morning Star”) are necessarily true but knowable only a posteriori—as opposed to Kant for whom only assertions valid a priori can be necessarily true. Also, there can be assertions which are true contingently yet a priori valid, as in the sentence “I am now here”. Hoeffe basically suggests that Kripke’s theory would not in general deny the possibility of synthetic a priori judgments, but only their necessity (62-4). However, it seems rather questionable what actually remains of Kantian synthetic a priori judgments if they are deprived of necessity. Hoeffe also argues that Kripke’s program is actually not at all related to Kant’s, since proper names do not play any role in Kant’s theory. It is true that Kant does not give a theory of proper names. But Kripke’s theory is not dealing with proper names as just a special phenomenon; rather, he derives a general theory of reference from them. So to defend Kant against Kripke would have to at least include the question to what extent Kant is bound to the traditional descriptivist theory of reference, and to what extent this has an influence on his distinction between synthetic and analytic judgments.

Quine argues that it is impossible to make precise distinctions between synthetic and analytic judgments, but that they can be distinguished only gradually. So that in the network of our beliefs there is a graduated series of sentences, with the sentences of logic at the center and observation sentences at the borders, rather than a hierarchy of clearly distinct stages. Hoeffe holds that one can argue that Quine’s network turns out (contrary to Quine’s intentions) to be a pyramid of higher and lower epistemological stages, and that such a pyramid would be compatible with the Critique (64 f.). This is indeed an interesting suggestion, but one would need further explanation than Hoeffe can give in a commentary. Also, this point does not change the basic fact (which Hoeffe of course does not deny) that for Kant judgments are either analytic or synthetic, with no gradations between them (cf. Critique A 8 B 10).

(2) Concerning truth, according to Hoeffe, Kant integrates the correspondence theory with both the coherence theory and the consensus theory (158-164). Hoeffe calls this integrated account the “unified theory” of truth (162). Hoeffe concedes that Kant did not develop an explicit theory of truth but maintains that one lies implicit in other aspects of his transcendental philosophy. Kant’s definition of truth basically follows the correspondence theory, i.e. he defines truth as correspondence of cognition and object (cf. Critique B 82). But Hoeffe points with good reasons to the fact that Kant also refers to aspects of a coherence theory (161 f.). According to coherence theories, propositions are justified not as single units but as systems. The first and obvious level of coherence is Kant’s application of the criterion of freedom from contradiction, which is the highest principle of all analytic judgments. The second level lies implicit in the “I think” which accompanies all representations, which is, however, a potential and merely formal connection of the representations. But this connection corresponds to the third level of coherence, the objective unity of all objects which forms the sum-total of the world and is due to the categories, schemata, and principles (especially the analogies of experience). The fourth level of coherence is the connectedness of nature according to general laws (such as causality), which fully developed—on the fifth level—forms the overall connectedness of nature which cannot be fulfilled but has to remain a regulative idea, as formulated in the transcendental dialectic. The sixth level of correspondence lies, according to Hoeffe, in the fact that some assertions are valid not only at a certain point of time, but always.

Hoeffe holds that, in a strictly anti-relativistic way, Kant also subscribes to a consensus theory. There are clearly passages where Kant talks about universality in the sense of “shared by all subjects”. But the question is why Kant thinks that certain views would be shared by all subjects. It seems to be more likely that he would understand such shared views as direct consequences of their necessity and objective validity rather than as a result of a process of consensus-making (which could also have a different result).

(3) Kant rejects all three classical solutions for the body-mind-problem: interactionism, occasionalism, and parallelism, all of which are based on the assumption of a substance dualism of body and mind. He instead holds a monistic position, arguing that both body and mind are appearances. So Kant’s solution is directly related to the general distinction between appearances and things in themselves insofar as both body and mind are appearances. Hoeffe rightly argues that contemporary debates, when going into the history of the problem (as for example Ryle does), tend to take dualism as the classical position and ignore the fact that Kant had already formulated an alternative monistic account.

According to Hoeffe, Kant’s monism is also relevant to contemporary debates about property dualism, i.e. the question whether mental properties are reducible to physical properties. He argues that Kant holds a property monism in the sense that he thinks mental and physical properties are of the same kind. At the same time, Hoeffe argues that Kant holds a secondary property dualism between the pure and the empirical I, and, when it comes to the relationship between theoretical and practical philosophy, an overall dualism between nature and freedom.

As far as the systematic commentary is concerned, Hoeffe is quite successful in providing the reader with an accessible guide to the Critique. He writes with a sovereign mastery of Kant’s work. Hoeffe’s book also offers a good survey of important secondary literature, including recent work. Another useful aspect is that at some stages, Hoeffe also discusses the context of Kant’s time, e.g. the relation of his theory of space to Leibniz’s, Descartes’s, and Newton’s (90-3), as well as Kant’s general relation to Descartes (142-5).

However, when it comes to relating Kant to the contemporary discussions, the size of this commentary inevitably prevents Hoeffe from sufficiently elaborating his views. In many cases, the reader would probably like to have a more detailed explanation of these views. He quite usefully points to the variety of contemporary topics that one can address with Kantian resources. But, in the context of a commentary, it might have been more useful to just state the aspects of Kant’s theory that can be related to contemporary questions, without getting into the questions of whether Kant can offer answers to them.