Karl Jaspers: A Biography. Navigations in Truth

Placeholder book cover

Suzanne Kirkbright, Karl Jaspers: A Biography. Navigations in Truth, Yale University Press, 2004, 360pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0300102429.

Reviewed by Charles Bambach, University of Texas, Dallas


What might it mean to order a life philosophically? To narrate it in such a way that what predominates is less the logic of narrative itself than the philosophical meaning of the life that cuts at the very heart of such logic? Only the very boldest of philosophers have dared attempt to thematize "biography" as a viable genre for philosophical reflection, and they have directed its optic back to their own lives. In Augustine's and Rousseau's Confessions, in Nietzsche's Ecce Homo , and in Derrida's Circumfessions we find the philosophical gaze directed back at the philosopher's own life where the demands of biography retreat in deference to the philosophical voice of self-expression. Rarely have philosophers attempted biography, or when they have, as in the case of Plato's Apology, Lukacs's The Young Hegel, or Dilthey's The Life of Schleiermacher, the traditional themes of biographical narrative have receded in favor of an explicitly philosophical engagement with the thinker' s work. Within contemporary academic scholarship there has been a flurry of biographies over the last decade or so dealing with 20th-century philosophers: lives of Foucault, Bataille, Heidegger, Wittgenstein, Popper, Ayer, Sartre, and Adorno among others. This outpouring of biographies has generated its own genre of scholarly writing different from the cottage industry of literary and artistic biographies that so often depend on archival correspondence and family records. Most biographies of philosophers, by contrast, while employing archival and philological research, tend to be text-focused rather than life-focused. That is, they offer contextualized readings of major works by situating them in a philosopher' s life-world rather than providing a traditional narrative description of a philosopher's life.

In these attempts, the biographical topic of the philosopher's life gives way to a celebration of the life of philosophy. The point of such work, Dilthey observes, is to grasp the life of the philosopher within the larger historical structure of an epoch in order to uncover its universal meaning. Such meaning can never be imposed on the philosopher's life, Dilthey claims; rather, it can only grow out of the self-understanding of the philosopher herself. In this way, philosophical biography begins to open up a hermeneutics of the historical life-world as it offers a history of spirit rooted in the intellectual-spiritual life experiences of the philosopher in history. From the perspective of our own post-structuralist understanding of philosophy, Dilthey's claims can be easily rejected as having imbibed too much of the Hegelian metaphysics of universal spirit and historical progress. But despite all its limitations, Dilthey's hermeneutical understanding of philosophical biography points us towards a genuinely philosophical engagement with human life, one that demands what Dilthey calls an "immanent critique"-- a critique that results not from the imposition of any external standards of judgment, but rather grows out of the philosophical work itself. In this sense, the task of the biographer involves the presentation of a philosopher's life with the aim of grasping the philosopher's thought so as to be able to engage it critically from a position that is thoroughly familiar with its inner structure.

In her new biography Karl Jaspers: Navigations in Truth, Suzanne Kirkbright demonstrates that she is familiar with the wide range of Jaspers's work -- from its early focus on psychology and medicine to the existential philosophy of the middle years to the deeply political critique of German culture and society of the postwar era. Using primary sources unavailable to previous Jaspers's scholars -- including diaries and extensive personal correspondence from both Jaspers' family and from that of his wife Gertrude -- Kirkbright has written a biography that celebrates Jaspers as one of the "good Germans" in an era marked by German political repression, violence, and terror. Relying heavily on this family correspondence as a constant point of reference for narrating and interpreting Jaspers's personal history, Kirkbright professes that she "seeks to illuminate the connection between Jaspers's life and works." To this extent, she claims, "his life can be seen in this biography to have been dedicated to illuminating the implications of truth with reference to the guiding light of reason"(p.xx). As she unfolds her story, what emerges is a tale of an upper middle-class son of privilege in northern Germany who, despite an early illness that perforated his lung and threatened his life, emerged to embark on a successful career as a university professor. Abandoning his early study of law at Freiburg and Heidelberg, Jaspers moved to Berlin where he took up the study of medicine. Later he would move to Göttingen and then back to Heidelberg as he began in earnest to train as a psychologist.

In her treatment of this formative period, Kirkbright cites the intimate family letters between Jaspers and his parents that provide an excellent source for understanding the reverential family dynamic of turn-of-the-century German bourgeois culture. As she presents Jaspers's inner struggles with his self-confidence about health and vitality, she draws a portrait of a man who learns to trust himself because he is so greatly trusted by his closest family members. When, at age 24, he meets Gertrud Mayer--four years his senior and a Jew--Kirkbright finds that the social obstacles to their union presents Jaspers with a new challenge that will define his life: how to integrate his own need for intimate partnership with his reliance on his own family. Out of the Gertrud-Karl relationship, Kirkbright discovers a model for ethical life since for her their "marriage evolved into a paradigm of communication as a 'loving contest'" that in turn became essential for Jaspers's own philosophical work. Kirkbright is at her best when on the basis of these intimate family relations--his father's artwork, his brother's suicide, Gertrud's cousin's nervous breakdown--she makes important connections to Jaspers's written work and his choice of philosophical topoi. Nowhere is she more convincing than in her analysis of the Jaspers' shared struggles during the Nazi years when, because of their "mixed marriage", each was in desperate danger from the Gestapo, even going so far as to plan a mutual suicide pact in the event of their capture. Out of these terrible personal experiences, Jaspers turns to a liberal humanist critique of German culture in the postwar years in his works on The Question of German Guilt (1946), Der philosophische Glaube (1947), and The Atom Bomb and the Future of Man (1958). Here Kirkbright chronicles Jaspers's development as the public conscience of German liberalism who, in embodying the Kantian demand for ethical integrity and the Goethean classicism of the Bildungstradition, opened the German public to a democratic ethos of free speech and public responsibility.

In her sympathetic portrait, Kirkbright offers a view of Jaspers as the consummate voice of integrity, a man who, in overcoming personal illness and political persecution, emerged as the ethical conscience for German humanist values in an age of military and technological upheaval. She succeeds in drawing an intimate portrait of this eminently private bourgeois thinker who addressed the public realm from his own personal experience. As Kirkbright puts it, "what Jaspers achieved in his approach to thinking may be mirrored in his attempts to reach a deeper level of communication among family and friends. At times he succeeded; at other times, he failed. Jaspers's journey through life could be called a series of navigations in truth that record his experiences and reflect the peace and security which he enjoyed with his wife and which, together, they hoped might endure within and beyond their lifetime" (pp.xxii-xxiii). In this sense Kirkbright's biography needs to be understood as a detailed psychological analysis of Jaspers's family life that grasps it as the decisive influence for his philosophy. And while any readers interested in Jaspers will glean helpful insights about his life from this painstaking reconstruction of his private diaries and intimate family correspondence, they will learn little here about the philosophical works themselves. Nowhere does Kirkbright offer sustained textual analysis of any of Jaspers's works. For her, the texts serve as helpful sources for understanding the life, but rarely does she make a sustained effort to see the life as a way of illuminating the texts. By focusing so particularly on life issues at the expense of texts, Kirkbright misses an essential demand of philosophical biography -- that it open up the life of philosophy, as Dilthey stressed, rather than merely the philosopher's life. By spending more time assessing the effects of his parents' values, his brother's recklessness, his wife's devotion to his work than on the significance of his philosophical texts, Kirkbright has served Jaspers poorly. His reputation as a second-tier thinker in 20th-century German philosophy will hardly shift as a result of this study. If Jaspers's works are to receive a fair reading among continental philosophers both in Great Britain and North America, they will have to be addressed for their philosophical relevance rather than their biographical interest. Such a change would require a philosophical biography along the lines of another recent Yale University Press publication, the insightful biography of Hans-Georg Gadamer by Jean Grondin.

Since Kirkbright's book focuses so heavily on family themes, it forgets to situate Jaspers more broadly in the rich intellectual world of 20th-century German thought. Although she does address Jaspers's varied relationships with Max Weber, Rudolf Bultmann, Martin Heidegger, and Georg Lukacs, Kirkbright nonetheless fails to engage their genuinely philosophical significance. Moreover, we get little feel for Jaspers's presence as a teacher, doctoral advisor, and colleague; where we do find sections on Jaspers public persona, they tend to be colored by a reverence and admiration that borders on the hagiographic. And while Kirkbright's book shows a real commitment to philological rigor and scholarly precision, it fails in the one decisive realm of academic scholarship that matters most: engaged critique. Because Kirkbright refuses to criticize Jaspers's work or address its generational limitations, we are left with a study that reduces it to mere antiquarian interest rather than vital hermeneutic engagement. If Jaspers's works are to be revived for their philosophical significance then they will have to be questioned at their root. Through such questioning alone will they survive. Does, for example, Jaspers's form of humanism still prove viable in the post-humanist form of Nietzschean-Heideggerian thinking? And what of his ethical positions on atomic warfare and social responsibility? How might they be reconfigured to address the problems facing the European Union? Moreover, are Jaspers's existential notions of "limit situations" and "metaphysical guilt" so tied to the political and cultural world of 20th-century German life that they no longer speak to our own postmodern predicament? Anyone unfamiliar with Jaspers's work will find these questions meaningful. For unlike Heidegger, Jaspers saw clearly the need for overcoming the toxic nationalism of German politics and embracing a genuinely international ethos of tolerance and cultural integration. What remains vital in Jaspers is precisely this form of philosophical internationalism that grows out of his life experiences, but whose meaning lies elsewhere. Because of Kirkbright's reverential stance, we will probably need to wait for another, more philosophically engaged biography before we can properly assess the relevance of Jaspers's thought for understanding these pressing issues.