Karl Popper's Philosophy of Science: Rationality Without Foundations

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Stefano Gattei, Karl Popper's Philosophy of Science: Rationality Without Foundations, Routledge, 2009, 137pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415378314.

Reviewed by Friedrich Stadler, University of Vienna and Miles MacLeod, University of Vienna



There is a sense today in which the imaginativeness and breadth of Popper’s philosophical system has been somewhat forgotten. For the most part, elements of his philosophy such as his philosophy of science are treated in isolation and then compared unfavourably to the work of writers such as Kuhn. In courses we teach that Popper failed to understand the complexity of scientific methodology and scientific culture, and is thus an illustration of what goes wrong when philosophers treat science abstractly, even though it was the abstractions of logical empiricism that he was chiefly writing against. History is thus in some sense monumentally unfair to Popper by dividing his philosophical systems up in this way. The real ingenuity and strength of Popper’s philosophy lies at a deeper level, in its proposed unification of all human knowledge on an anti-foundationalist methodological (rather than theoretical) notion of rationality and objectivity. This unification ties science together with political theory, liberalism, and human freedom within one unified epistemic and ethical system.

Gattei’s text sets out to reassert the revolutionary character of Popper’s work in the philosophy of science, while emphasizing that this philosophy is itself just one aspect of a revolutionary epistemological program, and that it can be fully articulated, understood, and thus properly valued only in relation to this program. The program is that of ‘critical rationalism’, which breaks the centuries long tradition of linking rationality and objectivity to justification by understanding rationalism as a methodological commitment (rather than a theoretically justified notion). In particular, the commitment is to critical dialogue (or falsificationism in the context of science) in all human intellectual pursuits. As is well known, Popper rejects all forms of epistemological foundationalism. He takes seriously, unlike many then and since, the problem of induction as the end of all attempts to justify knowledge, and maintains instead that the rationality and objectivity of knowledge must rest on the manner in which claims are discussed, criticized and rejected. As Gattei puts it, rationality in this sense is not so much a property of knowledge as a task for humans. For a rational endeavour, indeterminism is the only consistent metaphysics and democracy the only consistent political system. The choice to follow rationality is a moral decision and does not itself require justification. Likewise truth should not be understood as dependent on justification. Truth is a regulative ideal that guides the very process of knowledge formation and sustains it, even if truth itself remains unattainable or unknowable. Realism is the only metaphysics consistent with this sort of pursuit of truth.

For Gattei critical rationalism is the starting point of all of Popper’s philosophy, not just in its scope but also in its temporal development. Popper was driven by the principle of critical rationalism throughout his intellectual life. Gattei therefore uses ‘critical rationalism’ as the organizing and unifying principle of his account of Popper’s philosophy of science and its development. This allows him to present Popper’s work coherently, as well as with remarkable simplicity and clarity.

The book is divided into five chapters, the first on Popper’s intellectual development in Vienna from 1927 to 1934. This provides the context for his development of critical rationalism in the Logik der Forschung, which was published 1934 in a series edited by Philipp Frank and Moritz Schlick. Gattei tries to show how Popper’s philosophy emerges out of his own attempts to use the tools and principles of logical positivism, such as inductivism and conventionalism, which he abandoned one by one under the influence of the Würzburg school. The demarcation problem itself was critical in leading Popper towards his falsifiability criterion. Gattei’s point in fleshing out this history is faithful to his main principle of illustrating the character of Popper’s ideas through their own history and the work he had to do to arrive at them. Unlike Popper’s autobiographical accounts of his reasoning (framed somewhat in terms of his own yet uninvented methodology), this account is full of Popper’s missteps, wrong directions, and intellectual impasses.

In this discussion, Gattei does not fully take into account recent research on the relation between Popper and the Vienna Circle, in particular his encounter with the anti-foundationalist Otto Neurath, and his conversations with Herbert Feigl, Felix Kaufmann, and Viktor Kraft, who had developed a critical realism earlier than and independently of Popper. Regrettably, Gattei reproduces uncritically some related myths (following Popper’s autobiographical chapter “Who Killed Logical Positivism?”) about Popper’s intellectual development in the context of logical empiricism.

The next two chapters shift from an historical perspective to a more descriptive one, giving broad accounts of Popper’s philosophy of science - relying principally on the Logic of Scientific Discovery - and his position on metaphysical positions such as realism and indeterminism. These chapters illustrate the power and reach of critical rationalism and antifoundationalism. The fourth chapter is probably the most critical for Gattei’s interpretation (and certainly the most interesting chapter in the book). It challenges the orthodoxy view, which misleadingly assumes that Kuhn (perhaps because of his enormous influence and his responsibility for the so called ‘historical turn’) broke the grip of logical empiricism and linguistic analysis on philosophy of science. As Gattei argues, the claim that Kuhn undermined a whole philosophical tradition is wrong. Unlike Popper’s, Kuhn’s philosophy of science is still committed to the foundationalist tenets of logical empiricism. Kuhn, like Wittgenstein before, breaks the link of justification and objective truth with rationality. He argues that justification and hence rationality is internal to the linguistic or conceptual system (or paradigm) in which scientists operate, thereby hugely undermining the epistemic claims of science. Nevertheless this conclusion is premised on the belief that rationality requires justification and so falls back on the essential foundationalist presupposition. In this sense Kuhn is unoriginal, merely extending foundationalism to its logical conclusion. He still in some sense tries to resolve the problem of induction, just not objectively. Popper on the other hand abandons the connection between rationality and justification and explores a purely anti-foundationalist epistemology. This marks Popper as a genuine revolutionary.

From this point of view, we can better analyze the agreement and disageement between Kuhn and Popper. As Gattei points out, there is agreement on quite a few issues. Methodologically, both are responding to logical empiricism. Also, both accept the theory-ladeness of observation and reject the idea that science proceeds by accumulation, emphasising the revolutionary processes by which scientific theories are overthrown. Nevertheless the differences that derive from their disagreement over the foundations of knowledge are profound. For Popper, criticism and justification are separable, with criticism itself requiring no justification. As Gattei points out, for Kuhn (and Wittgenstein earlier) there can be no separation of the two. Criticism always operates within some framework, and we cannot challenge the framework, only ask questions within it.

In addition, revolutions for Kuhn are rare episodes while rationality implies commitment to a paradigm, whereas for Popper rationality requires the continual overthrow and challenge of established ideas. For Popper ‘normal science’ is continual revolution. Further, we can, according to Popper, define a notion of progress through refutations, which Popper does and formalizes somewhat with his concept of verisimilitude, whereas Kuhn holds that progress can be defined only sociologically or psychologically. While for Popper science is rational by virtue of its commitment to the unceasing and relentless criticism of its theories and assumptions, for Kuhn it is the very relaxation of this criticism that marks the beginning of normal science, which is fundamentally dogmatic. Kuhn’s scientific community is therefore close-minded.

Gattei contends, however, that their disagreement is basically over truth:

The core difference between Popper and Kuhn is not about the possibility of falsification, incommensurability, or the existence of normal science. It is about the role of truth, the value of criticism, and the nature of the bond that unites scientists into a community. (75)

Both agree that there is no objective criterion for truth, but Popper asserts that truth nonetheless takes a regulative role in scientific practice, whereas for Kuhn truth is of no use at all for understanding the problem-solving behavior of scientists. Kuhn, however, as Gattei points out, confused the concept of truth with its criterion, thus taking it to be a vacuous notion because of the lack of an objective criterion to determine it. For Popper truth is necessary to make sense of what scientists are doing and to sustain the very falsificationist methodology they apply.

These insights are quite important; they provide a clear contrast with Kuhn and emphasize the novelty of Popper’s approach. Gattei comments,

Instead of trying to build on the ruins of the collapsed edifice of the positivist research programme, as Kuhn himself did (and as his heirs and those of the Vienna Circle keep trying to do, only working on additional layers of ruins), we are presented with the project for a new edifice. (76)

Kuhn should be read as dealing with the old problem of how knowledge is guaranteed or justified, but seeking a foundation for knowledge that is external to philosophy. But here again we encounter the inadequate historiography that takes the “received view” as representative of the program of logical empiricism as well as of the project of the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science — to which Kuhn contributed his Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962). It would have been much more innovative to reconstruct the discussion between Kuhn and Popper (together with Lakatos and Feyerabend) on the occasion of the LSE conference in 1965.

The last chapter puts critical rationalism into its broader context as part of an ethical system that frames a general approach to all human activity, characterized by a willingness

to entertain any position, and hold anything in it … as open to criticism, without resorting to any authority, faith, or irrational commitment. Any position may be held rationally provided that it remain open to criticism and survives severe tests. (80)

It is natural of course to ask the question: Aren’t we then required to justify our commitment to such rationality? Not for Popper, according to Gattei. Popper, he argues, takes it to be simply a moral choice. In this respect Gattei argues against Bartley that Popper was falling into the trap of trying to ‘justify’ critical rationalism. Popper, Gattei asserts, made no such argument. His critical rationalism should be expressed not as a theory but as an attitude, “that is a disposition, a readiness to listen to each other’s critical arguments, to search for one’s own mistakes, and to learn from them, following the best argument in a critical debate” (81). This choice determines one’s very attitude and approach to life both scientifically and politically. As such, critical rationalism lies at the beginning of all philosophical discussions and helps them progress in parallel ways.

In all these respects, Gattei gives an informative reconstruction of Popper’s philosophy of science that emphasizes its essential unity, coherence and simplicity, and particularly its revolutionary aspect, which marks its real achievement. Our criticisms stem from the fact that what Gattei is doing here is to some extent a rational reconstruction of Popper’s philosophical system. As such it perhaps runs the risk of giving too much coherence to Popper’s work. This is so especially in the context of his metaphysics, where one has to look at a wider range of Popper’s texts from different periods to piece together an overall account. This, however, is not the essential problem we have with this book. Our problem is with the essentially hagiographical modus operandi, which gives a misleading impression of the strength of Popper’s philosophy. For example, Gattei never mentions the problems Popper had to address in “A Reply to my Critics”, problems that to some extent force Popper to weaken his own claims. In particular, there is no mention of Lakatos’ strong criticism that, on Popper’s terms, falsifications are very rare in scientific practice. Non-corroborations are not necessarily falsifications and are usually not perceived in practice as falsifications. This is a problem with which Popper struggled, eventually agreeing that auxiliary hypotheses, etc. are part of any testing and part of the package that is falsified by a negative test result. Hence he was forced to shift his demarcation criterion from falsification itself to the way in which falsifications of theoretical and auxiliary groupings are dealt with. Ad hoc shifts simply to preserve a theory from falsification become the unscientific elements. Perhaps more significantly, it is difficult to find the basis upon which the falsification criterion could be anything other than conventional in Popper’s system, given his commitment to theory-ladenness. Popper of course vigorously rejected conventionalism, yet it seems a central part of falsification. Of course we are free to question the conventions associated with observation. Doing so, however, seems to undermine the point of falsification as a methodology, since it depends on having some kind of stable basis for relying on falsifications as objective events. If changing observation conventions can render previously falsified theories valid again, then it seems impossible to have any kind of progress.

These are well known criticisms and deserve more of an airing in any account of Popper’s work, particularly since they were criticisms to which Popper himself had to respond. Nevertheless the principal problem with Gattei’s reconstruction is that it papers over the critical interpretative question for Popper scholarship. This is the deep tension throughout Popper’s account of science (and his general epistemological program) over whether he is giving a descriptive or normative account of science. This is often apparent in deep ambiguities in what he has to say. His critical rationalism can be read as a normative program, especially when its link to ethics is emphasized. His account of science often takes a perspective that is less about what scientists do and more about what critical rationalist methodology would require of scientists. How we interpret Popper in this respect completely determines how we respond to his arguments, and of course ignoring the issue is likely to give a coherence to Popper’s assertions that doesn’t exist. Popper can in fact be read as quite uncertain about the normative and descriptive dimension of his programme with respect to science.

Gattei however doesn’t discuss this question but plays Popper’s game of slipping between description and normativity. This has ramifications that Gattei overlooks for how we understand the clash between Kuhn and Popper. To some extent Kuhn and Popper are talking past one another. Kuhn sets out to give a chiefly descriptive account of science, and does so, on the basis of historical patterns. Popper is working normatively from his critical rationalist methodology, which itself could be taken as a criticism of what Kuhn sees as the normal scientific practice unquestioningly accepting the paradigm. In this sense the normative Popper and the descriptive Kuhn don’t necessarily clash. The level of miscommunication between Popper and Kuhn in this respect is at least worth considering. However of course this only goes so far. When Kuhn decides to draw lessons for metaphysics and epistemology from his descriptive account of science, then a clash between the two is inevitable. Gattei in fact rightly describes the encounter between Popper and Kuhn as basically a dispute over metaphysics. On this level, Gattei’s point about the revolutionary nature of Popper’s work holds, and Kuhn is more or less simply interpreting his descriptive results in terms of a foundationalist epistemology.

In sum, Gattei’s Karl Popper’s Philosophy of Science is an important reassertion of the value, novelty, and coherency of Popper’s programme. It is an important historiographical contribution, particularly because it leads us to reevaluate our tradition of painting Kuhn as an epistemological radical, when that title more properly belongs to Popper. Chapter 1 does not fully come up to the current state of the art, but Chapters 2 and 3 provide a useful introduction to Popper’s philosophy of science suitable for students and researchers alike. Chapter 4 on Kuhn and Popper should be fruitful for future scholarship.