Keeping Balance: On Desert and Propriety

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Diana Abad, Keeping Balance: On Desert and Propriety, Ontos, 2007, 202pp., $112.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793183.

Reviewed by Saul Smilansky, University of Haifa


Diana Abad sets out to explore the meaning of desert. She follows the conventional philosophical view that desert is a relation between three elements, so that "x deserves y in virtue of z". This incorporates Joel Feinberg's insistence that there must be a desert basis: a person (say) can deserve something only when there is a property or an action of hers for which she deserves that something. So, when a runner (x) deserves a prize (y), this must be in light of the existence of a desert basis (z), such as that he is the fastest runner. But Abad wishes to go further:

Unfortunately, Feinberg's analysis of desert judgments as three-place relations has tempted all other participants in the debate to regard the question pertaining to the replacement of the variables with particular individuals as the only one left open. This, however, does not help us at all if we want to know in what kind of relation these stand to each other, that is, if we want to know the very meaning of desert judgments. (pp.19-20)

Abad points out that Feinberg's seminal paper came out in 1963, and goes on to say: "That raises the question of why, in the more than 40 years since, nobody has ventured to follow the lead [given by Feinberg] I have pointed out in the last section, that desert and propriety are related, and tried to solve this puzzle" (p.21). The reply given is that this is due to the overwhelming influence of John Rawls, who shifted the moral and political debate toward the notion of fairness, and (mistakenly, in Abad's view) was thought to have discredited desert.

After presenting a preliminary account of her view, which relates desert to fittingness, in Part 2 of her book Abad searches for the meaning of propriety and desert in an admirably broad selection of sources, including Roderick Chisholm, Samuel Clarke, Richard Price, William Wollaston, and Immanuel Kant. Her own account of desert is this: "to deserve something means that it is appropriate that one get it because one is or has done something fitting" (p.9). She distinguishes between what is fitting and what is appropriate: her favorite example of the fitting is that of a broken bowl: the shards of the bowl fit together, but it is not necessarily required or appropriate that the bowl be reconstructed. Appropriateness, by contrast, is exemplified by a musical illustration: "the eighth note is fitting to the first seven of the major scale already played, and furthermore, it is required as well" (p.143).

In Part 3 of her book, Abad applies her understanding of desert to two test cases, retributive justice and moral residue (in moral dilemmas). She does not discuss in a thorough way the metaphysical grounding of desert, but what she does say is certainly striking: "this concept of desert has a high metaphysical price: first, it presupposes propriety, that is, it presupposes incomplete states of affairs that require completion; and second, it presupposes Platonic Forms" (p.148). The book concludes by giving "An explanation for the persistence of the concept of desert against all odds", an explanation that Abad attributes to Kant: "we human beings simply work that way that [sic] propriety is important to us, and that we must hope for the world to be in balance" (p.187).

Abad correctly points out that desert has been relatively neglected in recent philosophy, and that further work is required. I also agree that central aspects of our moral universe cannot be explicated without the notion of desert. Hence I welcome this addition to the literature. Yet, the discussion suffers from several problems. Take, first, the discussion of Rawls on desert. One of the major points of contention is whether the desert basis itself requires to be deserved. Rawls says that pre-institutional desert cannot be the basis for a fair system of justice, for no one deserves her native talents, nor the social influences that mold her in utilizing those talents. But all that Abad says in response is that "This argument is absurd: it is wholly implausible that we cannot ascribe to ourselves anything we do that depends on our native endowments. It is enough, as Nozick rightly says, to have them and to use them" (p.23). One does not have to be a hard determinist to see that Abad's certainty is too quick.

Much of the book is taken with a discussion of earlier historical views; they, however, are not systematically exposited and connected but rather serve as material for Abad to sift through, towards the view she argues for. This view, the purported meaning of desert, is surely the purpose of the book. But, regrettably, I find it somewhat trivial. "[T]o deserve something means that it is appropriate that one get it because one is or has done something fitting" is rather commonsensical, and indeed roughly what one would find in a good dictionary.

One would have hoped that the applications, in Part 3 of the book, would help to make the results philosophically deeper. The retributivist view that Abad chooses to discuss is Jean Hampton's. This is not an ideal choice, as Hampton's communicative-educative view on punishment is not quite representative of mainstream retributivism. But setting this aside, we get the following conclusion:

Hampton's theory is based on the very concept of desert I have expounded in this book. 'The wrongdoer deserves punishment in virtue of lowering the victim' [i.e. Hampton's view] accordingly means 'In lowering the victim, the wrongdoer has treated her inappropriately which in turn makes it appropriate that he be punished'. (p.164)

I find this point obvious. It is a pity that Abad did not mention here Geoff Cupit's book Justice as Fittingness (Oxford University Press 1999).

The trouble, it seems, is that Abad is so concerned with keeping her distance from the many complex questions taken up in the contemporary debate, and remains only with the question of the definition of desert, that her work becomes somewhat barren and uninteresting. Take, for example, the relationship between desert and responsibility. One need not see all of desert as being conditional on responsibility, but were Abad to explore the conceptual and normative relationship among the two, she would have been able to say much more about the typical relationships between fittingness, propriety and desert. After all, we do have detailed and interesting stories as to why the innocent deserve no punishment at all, or why it might sometimes be fitting to mitigate the punishment of the guilty. These moral stories, which mostly have to do with the absence of responsibility or with its diminished nature, tell us why it would be inappropriate to inflict any punishment on the innocent; or to inflict a level of punishment that neither fits the crime nor reflects the circumstances surrounding it, even on the guilty. Such substantive discussions in moral theory (or the equivalents, concerning a-moral desert) would have enabled Abad to say much more than she does, and to consider more options than the Platonic Forms.