Kierkegaard and the Problem of Self-Love

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John Lippitt, Kierkegaard and the Problem of Self-Love, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 208pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107035614.

Reviewed by George Pattison, University of Glasgow


Although Kierkegaard's literary remains have been picked over to an exceptional degree, this is perhaps the first monograph devoted to the theme of self-love in Kierkegaard, even though most of those who have written about his view of love discuss it or at least mention it in passing. Yet, somehow, it has not until now received the kind of sustained attention it deserves. In fact, as John Lippitt tells us in the Introduction, his own original aim had been to produce a study of Kierkegaard's view of friendship, and 'the problem of self-love' only gradually emerged as a distinct topic in its own right.

But what is self-love? From the outset we are asked to put aside the view hyperbolically 'performed' in artist Jennifer Hoes' 'marriage' to herself, a marriage motivated (in her words) by the desire 'to celebrate with others how much I'm in love with myself' (p. 1). Yet if this seems to epitomize the narcissism of contemporary culture, Harry Frankfurt gives serious philosophical weight to the view 'that true self-love is "the deepest and most essential . . . achievement of a serious and successful life"' (p. 1). Later, Frankfurt will be the focus of a whole chapter, but, to begin, Lippitt notes that whilst Christianity has often criticized selfish self-love, it has also recognized the dangers of a lack of proper self-respect. Kierkegaard too testifies that 'any religion of love . . . would presuppose . . . one condition only and assume it as given: to love oneself in order to command loving the neighbour as oneself' (p. 3).

As we have seen, Lippitt's original question concerned friendship, and he early on shows how reflection on the nature of friendship leads us to the question of self-love. A guiding insight is that Kierkegaard is not hostile to friendship. However, this seems to fly in the face of Kierkegaard's clear endorsement of non-preferential love as the best kind of love and his depiction of friendship as a form of preferential love and, consequently, a form of improper self-love. This is manifested in the exclusiveness of friendship and the depiction of the friend as a second self or as a mirror to everything I like about myself. But the question then is whether all self-love is 'improper' or whether there may also be a 'proper' self-love. Lippitt believes -- and believes that Kierkegaard believes -- that there is and that the point is not to eliminate preferential love but only the selfishness of self-love. Thus, friendship may not only confirm us in self-satisfaction but can also 'draw' us beyond ourselves so as to develop possibilities that, without the friend, we would never have known. Even more important is the possibility that we might love the friend 'in God', or, in Kierkegaard's parlance, make God 'the middle term' of the relationship, a kind of 'filter', as Lippitt puts it. However, this threatens to draw the question of friendship into Kierkegaard's (and, in large part, Christianity's) negative portrayal of the relationship between God and world, which, in Kierkegaard's case, also seems to carry demands for extreme self-denial and self-sacrifice.

Stepping back from these questions, Lippitt turns to the more general question of special relationships, focussing his discussion on a recent debate between M. Jamie Ferreira and Sharon Krishek, where Krishek takes Kierkegaard to task for failing to endorse legitimate self-love outside very narrow limits and for undervaluing the embodied character of human existence with its concomitant desires. Kierkegaard, she thinks, assumes that loving the friend above all others will lead to loving the friend in contrast to all others, and therefore be inappropriately exclusive. However, Lippitt contends that Kierkegaard does not deny embodiment (as his treatment of the parable of the Good Samaritan shows) and he rejects the claim that sees preferential love as necessarily exclusive. Key passages show that Kierkegaard understands that loving one's spouse or friend 'as a neighbour' does not mean loving them in exactly the same way as we love others. Kierkegaard himself characteristically expresses this in the paradoxical exclamation: 'For what is as difficult as to make no distinction at all in loving, and if one makes no distinction at all, what is as difficult as making distinctions!' (quoted on pp. 86-7). Again the role of the God-filter comes into play so as to reveal neighbour love to be a kind of rough sketch made concrete in the detail of actual relationships.

Lippitt next takes a chapter to comment on Frankfurt's positive appraisal of self-love, which he finds to be actually unattainable and not as separable from our relationships to others as Frankfurt himself supposes. After this excursus, he returns to the question as to whether Kierkegaard's model of love is, in the end, too extreme. This time the focus is on self-denial and Sylvia Walsh is presented as spokesperson for the view that Kierkegaardian love is ultimately all about self-denial. As she puts it, 'Christian love is self-denying love' (quoted on p. 111). She also depicts this as the opposite of a selfish self-love that is equated with the 'natural' tendency of human love. Like Kierkegaard himself, she does not really provide the detail that would enable us to see what this might mean, and where Walsh seems to imply that Kierkegaard asks us to cease loving ourselves, Lippitt worries that this brings the Dane too close to a Levinasian state of 'persecution by the Other' (p. 121). However, he does appear to concur with the view that there are grounds for such a reading in Kierkegaard himself, especially his later writings. Nevertheless, Lippitt asks, 'why should we suppose that rejection by the world is an essential element of Christianity?' (p. 124) But, although he then proposes what might be called a middle way, he acknowledges that this cannot be an 'easy set of techniques' (p. 134), and avoiding extremes of self-sacrifice and self-love must be a matter of practical wisdom, not a priori rules.

The next three chapters turn towards a more positive account of self-love, with emphasis on the virtues of trust, hope, and forgiveness. The tone of this discussion is set by an important quotation from Kierkegaard himself: 'one should never lose belief or hope in one's ability (through God's grace) to will and act in the light of, and for, the good' (p. 137). Despite Kierkegaard's reputation for melancholy, this gives a firm steer against any kind of self-despair. As recommending basic attitudes of trust and hope, it also warns against the speciously prudential strategy of being unwilling to trust others and encourages us to trust in our ability to do good. Although this may lead some to complacency, most people are likely to find such self-confidence rather demanding and in need of constant renewal. Nevertheless, if we can do it, it will sustain us in our ability to help others. Thus, Kierkegaard's view is to be distinguished from the classic Christian view that one must combine generosity towards others with harshness towards oneself.

A similar pattern emerges in respect of hope. For whilst Kierkegaardian hope is ultimately hope for an eternal salvation, this also includes what Lippitt calls 'a more quotidian variety of hoping' (p. 147) -- and, again, this comprises hoping for oneself (although this time, Kierkegaard himself expressly states this [p. 148]). This is a theme that Lippitt traces back to Kierkegaard's earliest series of upbuilding discourses from 1842-44, and whose value he illustrates with reference to the therapeutic lessons drawn by Viktor Frankl from the experiences of Holocaust survivors.

These themes of trust and hope feed easily into that of self-forgiveness, where Lippitt offers a particularly interesting discussion of whether self-forgiveness presupposes an act of forgiveness by the one who has been wronged -- or whether we can forgive ourselves in the absence of such external forgiveness. Here, acknowledging all the dangers of evasion and self-deceit, Lippitt comes to the view that we can and sometimes should be self-forgiving. He further bolsters this position with the Christian hypothesis that since all forgiveness is ultimately from God, knowing ourselves recognized and forgiven by God provides grounds for self-forgiveness that are relatively independent of the forgiveness that society is prepared to bestow. Perhaps surprisingly, given that he briefly cites him earlier, Lippitt does not here call on Tillich's idea of the paradoxical acceptance of being accepted in spite of our being unacceptable -- but this, I take it, is the thrust of his own argument, culminating in a position of what he calls 'humble self-respect'. Yet he also goes one step further, arguing that it is also acceptable to take a proper pride in one's own moral achievements. Against Kierkegaard's Protestant view that we can claim no merit for anything that we do, Lippitt suggests 'a more Catholic emphasis' (p. 188) that would allow us to take pride in what we ourselves do, in fact, contribute to the triumph of the good. All of this is, of course, a long way from the kind of self-love manifest in Jennifer Hoes' marriage to herself.

As I hope this summary shows, this is a tightly argued and philosophically well-informed book that draws on a detailed knowledge of Kierkegaard's work and of the relevant secondary literature. As such, it provides a useful point of entry for students and established scholars into the internal complexity of Kierkegaard's moral thought and the issues it addresses. The position it constructively advances is humane, compassionate, and sensible, but also not undemanding. Yet, as Lippitt himself amply demonstrates, there is unlikely to be consensus on exactly how we are to read Kierkegaard at certain crucial points. Part of the issue here seems to me to relate to the nature of the key text at issue, Works of Love, for this is not a philosophical treatise on love. If it were, Kierkegaard could readily be taken to task for many of his omissions and extreme statements. Instead, it is a treatise in the form of discourses that is prefaced by a prayer. In other words, it is a rhetorically-determined text that, if not exactly sermonical, uses the preacher's liberty to propose dramatic and sometimes hyper-dramatic examples and to indulge in a certain one-sidedness in order to make a point. And the point is -- always -- not to arrive at a philosophically satisfying conception of love but to urge the reader on in his or her efforts really to live a life of active love.

I am not saying that a philosophical reading such as Lippitt offers here is inappropriate and I agree when he rejects the charge that such a reading is invariably a kind of pharisaical prevarication and self-justification (pp. 4ff.). My point is rather that any such reading is going to have to acknowledge a certain distance from Kierkegaard's text and that such an acknowledgement actually makes the interpreter's task rather easy. Why? Because it absolves us from the task of having to define the position we want to advance as 'Kierkegaard's'. Precisely because of its rhetorical character, Kierkegaard's text actually leaves open a range (though not an infinite range) of philosophical options. Thus, we can take the text as a starting point for our own reflections and constructions without having to establish a 'true' reading. This restraint allows us both to accept some of Kierkegaard's more extreme statements at face value (rather than having to explain them away) whilst also being able to use the text in the service of a more 'quotidian' ethics. In the end, Lippitt does acknowledge that the position he is advancing is not identical with Kierkegaard's own, but he has perhaps been needlessly over-anxious along the way to keep Kierkegaard onside. Lippitt is certainly no teacher of easy comfort and what he says about proper self-love makes much psychological sense -- a true 'practical wisdom'. Kierkegaard's task, however, was to unsettle and disturb his readers' reliance on their own wisdom and, whilst not refusing the consolations of trust, hope, and forgiveness, ensuring that the price of such consolations involved a certain self-annihilation (whatever that means!).

As I have said, Kierkegaard and the Problem of Self-Love offers an extremely tight argument. That is a large part of its merit. The inevitable obverse is that Lippitt has sometimes foregone further exploration of the ways in which his examples of moral situations could be nuanced and deepened, e.g., by drawing on the resources of novelists, dramatists, and historians. One cannot have everything, and perhaps it is in the end a virtue that at many points we are left to do further work for ourselves in reflecting on how exactly the point at issue might take shape in the actual configuration of human life.

It is frustrating to end a review at the point at which one is just beginning to engage with what is really at issue in the text. In this case, I take such frustration to be indicative of the exceptional stimulus to further reading and thinking that Lippitt has given his readers.