Kingdoms of God

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Kevin Hart, Kingdoms of God, Indiana University Press, 2014, 326pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253014498.

Reviewed by Felix Ó Murchadha, National University of Ireland, Galway


Kevin Hart’s book is a rich collection of 13 essays (some but not all of which have been published previously in different forms) discussing the question of the Christian preaching of a salvation through God as Trinity. The essays are presented as a kind of promissory note to a book of systematic theology which Hart is in the process of writing (2). They range historically, conceptually and in disciplinary terms over a wide area, but there is a consistent thread throughout centering both methodologically and substantially around a ‘phenomenology of Christ’.

The book has 5 parts. Beginning with St. Augustine, the essays involve careful readings also of Aquinas, Fichte, Kant, Hegel, Kierkegaard, Bonhoeffer, Jankélévitsch, and Derrida, while Barth, Marion, and the Patristic fathers are constant companions. The central chapters (making up Part 3, “Manifestations”), both with respect to the structure of the book and the conceptual integrity of the project, articulate Hart’s own vision of phenomenology. It is fruitful to read this book on the basis of those central essays.

In those three essays, which address God as the Trinity, Hart makes clear that phenomenology, as he understands it, is not purely a philosophical approach or method. Pointing out that phenomenology “teaches us not to concede that philosophy, as a historical discourse, has the right to establish the final meaning of any experience or non-experience”, he asks us to “regard phenomenology as a mode of thinking that participates in theology” (176). Furthermore, while we may date the articulation of phenomenology to the work of Edmund Husserl, the latter’s work “gives philosophical precision to ways of being in the world that have been practiced by earlier thinkers, artists, and religious persons” (3). While we may worry about the relation between such philosophical precision and artistic and religious practice and also note that implicit in this account is a rejection of any claims to strict phenomenological neutrality (176), the fundamental case being made here is that in the realm of theology, phenomenology requires a further reduction, which Hart terms the “basilaic reduction”. He reads the teachings of Jesus of Nazareth, in particular the parables, as exercises in such a reduction to the Kingdom. This reduction is “something which happens to us when we read or hear what Jesus has to say: we are led back to God’s prior claim on us, before we emerged as beings in the world, and we are constituted by God, made present to him, in and through our participation in the βασιλεία” (3). This involves for Hart a conversion, a turning away from our enthrallment with the world towards God. There are two movements here: kenosis, or self-emptying, and epektasis, or stretching out into love of God and neighbor. Husserl used the term ‘conversion’ in his understanding of the reduction, and Hart is thinking here also of Marion’s three reductions (131, 140). However, he is less concerned than Marion with keeping a clear boundary between theology and philosophy.

A theological phenomenology must begin with revelation as actuality. While Marion remains at the level of eidetic possibility, Hart insists in effect on the necessity of faith in theology. This he understands in terms of a being present to an absence: “He [God] is absent from us, yet we are present to him” (147.) It is this paradoxical situation which lies at the core of the preaching of the βασιλεία, and it is this which Hart understands as the “phenomenology of Christ” in which the genitive functions both subjectively and objectively. Such a phenomenology is one which believes the ‘testified Jesus’ to be Christ and which responds to the reduction which he performs in his teaching. Understanding Jesus as a phenomenologist means following the manner in which he receives the phenomena of God: God himself does not appear, rather what “comes to the horizon of appearing is kingly rule of the father” (144). The βασιλεία is both here and to come, both external and internal and it is both revealed and “re-veiled”. In telling a parable, Jesus and his listeners (including those who read the testimony of others) bracket the world, loosening their captivity to the world and live in terms of the Kingdom.

The ‘prodigal son’ is the central parable Hart employs in expressing the Kingdom. As he points out, this is not usually regarded as a parable of the βασιλεία (145), but he convincingly shows the centrality of the father in the story and how the compassionate father resembles God’s kingly rule. If this is the case, the phenomenological question is, how does the father manifest himself in the story. The father is manifest in relation to his sons, a relationship which is asymmetrical: “the father gives life to his sons, and the sons cannot return the gift of life” (119). Hart makes clear that this should not be considered a parable of choice but rather of decision: not a choice to be more like the younger or older son but an indication that we should decide to be more like the father than either son, and through this decision the Kingdom of the father “breaks into our lives here and now” (127). Such a decision requires the hearer of the parable to be mindful of the manifestations of the father “not just in the miraculous moment of reconciliation but in accepting the leave taking [of the younger son], in anxiously watching for the younger son, and in coming out to speak to the elder son and deflecting his anger” (127). This manifestation is made possible through a reduction from a worldly logic of “exchange, honor, law, and convention” to a divine logic of “compassion and forgiveness” (131).

The father as manifest in this story is both like and unlike fathers we know: he manifests fatherly love and compassion in ways which exceed fathers in the world. Only that which transcends the world can realize the kingdom manifest in the father’s compassion, “yet it is in our acts of compassion, forgiveness, and sacrifice . . . that parts of its outline are discerned on Earth” (136).

The question then becomes one of how the Kingdom relates to the world. In Augustinian manner Hart makes clear that at issue is not a turning away from the world but rather a turning away from enthrallment by the world. Hart expresses the relation succinctly when he states: “The Kingdom is the truth of Creation, the truth that can be glimpsed again in a fallen world, and the truth of the world to come” (137). The temporal structure here reflects that disclosed in the Prodigal son parable “the fault is in the past, forgiveness is in the present, and justice is in the future.” (134) This temporality of the kingdom is one which happens as an interruption of life lived under the conatus essendi, which only Jesus can perform (148), and through it we are led back to a “prefatory state” in which the Kingdom is disclosed as anterior and yet futural. This temporality is manifest as “rhythm”: a rhythm of pain and consolation, “constant . . . but seldom regular” (151). It is a rhythm of kenosis and epektasis.

The double sight which is necessary here, one which sees the world in its worldliness and yet sees in it the Kingdom as anterior and posterior to it, Hart describes as contemplation (contemplatio), prayer and (borrowing from Augustine) evening and morning knowledge. Each involves a movement beyond captivation in the world to receptivity for that which transcends the world. Evening and morning knowledge refer to Augustine’s interpretation of the phrase “the evening and morning were the first day” in Genesis. In the evening, according to Augustine, the angels were given knowledge of things as they are in themselves; in the morning they were given knowledge of the relation of created things to the Creator (50, 69).

This phenomenology of Christ, this basilaic reduction, is central to the manner in which Hart reads the philosophical tradition’s attempts to mediate the Gospels philosophically. Kingdoms of God begins with Augustine’s Confessions and ends with reflections on the “Our Father”. Throughout Hart explores divergent texts, working through the different ways in which the tension between the world and Kingdom are negotiated.

Part 1, “Inward Life”, consists in two essays exploring Augustine and Fichte and Michel Henry respectively. With respect to Augustine he engages in a profound discussion of the passages in Book IX of the Confessions detailing the African bishop’s conversion in Ostia. He then goes on to analyze Henry’s appropriation of Fichte’s Religionslehre in his account of the inward life. Henry, however, for Hart ends in Gnosticism, missing the “radical historicity of Christianity” and missing too “Jesus who is the phenomenality of God: in his preaching, in his acts and in his suffering, death and resurrection”. (51)

Part 2, “Aspects of the Kingdom”, contains three chapters on Hegel, Kierkegaard and Bonhoeffer respectively. Themes foreshadowing those of the phenomenology of Christ thread through these essays: Hegel remains on the level of “evening knowledge” (69), something reflected in his emphasis on the crucifixion, but not the resurrection. The latter “involves a transformation of what is worldly in us” (68) and a passing “from the Cross as evening knowledge . . . to the Resurrection as morning knowledge” (74). Kierkegaard’s reflections (through his pseudonyms as well as in his own name) on the world display “little sense of the goodness of Creation” (79). As he had diagnosed with Henry, Kierkegaard here sounds “somewhat Gnostic instead of Christian” (81). Lacking is a sense of prayerful contemplation, which Hart understands as the “principal act of love we perform for God” (86). Finally, in his discussion of Bonhoeffer’s later work, Hart stresses the German theologian’s emphasis on the founding of the Kingdom “amidst sin and suffering, and not left to the life to come” (95).

Part 4, “Traces”, consists of three essays on Derrida which begin with a nuanced discussion of Kant’s later work. Stressing the heritage of Augustine in Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason, he shows how the Christian for Kant lives in two societies, the earthly and the heavenly, hoping for the day when the earthly society will pass away (184). Significantly, however, as Hart points out, Kant differs from Augustine in affirming that as citizens of the divine state on earth human beings are both legislators and subjects (186). Having interpreted the Kingdom of God in Kant in its likeness and unlikeness to Augustine, Hart then goes on to discuss Derrida’s reading of Kant. Succinctly he sets out the ways in which Derrida is like and is unlike Kant: like Kant, Derrida affirms the universal structure of religion against historical specificity; unlike Kant, he occludes any sharp line between reason and faith and regards the “call prior to all others, ‘come’, as [ethics’] very opening” (190). Hart asks, whether “Derrida inherit[s] too much from Kant with respect to religion?” (193) and responds in the affirmative: by allowing revelation to give way to ethics Derrida yields the historical to the structural and like Kant seeks the replacement of positive religions “with his reformulated religion of reason” (235).

Part 5, “Coda”, consists of two essays on Forgiveness and the Our Father respectively. In both he stresses the intervening of the Kingdom on earth and the interplay of activity and passivity on the part of human beings in this event. One aspect of this discussion that deserves attention concerns infused virtues. This picks up on a theme which we also find in his discussion of Kierkegaard. In theology infused virtues are those habits of goodness which are in excess of the natural capacities of human beings and are supernaturally infused or instilled in the human soul. As virtues they are habits which guide everyday behavior, but as infused they are traces of the Kingdom of God in the everyday. Furthermore, as virtues they are habitual and require development. With respect to both Kierkegaard and Jankélévitsch, Hart stresses this as meaning that love and forgiveness are “at the limit” of human capacity not “beyond that limit in an impossible, mad action.” (264)

In closing, I would like to pose two sets of questions and a concern. First set of questions: for whom is the basilaic reduction possible? The phenomenological reduction, in Husserl or in Marion, is open, potentially at least, to all. The basilaic reduction, however, can be performed only by Jesus (148), all other parables are “secular parables”, Hart states quoting Barth. For a Christian theologian this may be plausible but can it be for a philosopher (whether Christian or not)? If such a philosopher reads the parables, can she find herself in the basilaic reduction or must she make a previous act of faith in Jesus as the “living Christ” (144)? The same type of question applies to non-Christians, and Hart spends some time, especially in the final essay, discussing it. He distinguishes there between the phenomenality of God, as the one who reigns in the Kingdom, and the phenomenology of Jesus Christ. He suggests that while for Christians Christ is the phenomenality of God, the Kingdom of God is expressed otherwise in other religions (277). If that is the case, and if, as he stresses, there is a need to pass from a “theology of religions” to “comparative theology” (270), then it seems to follow that the basilaic reduction is one which can be encountered without Christ and perhaps outside of any particular religious denomination. Might, for example, Heraclitus’s “Fragment B52” perform a kind of basilaic reduction?

Second set of questions: In different ways fundamentalist readings of Christian, Muslim and Judaic discourses on the Kingdom have been and continue to be employed to justify violence and injustice. How does the basilaic reduction relate to such issues? For sure, as Hart discusses it, the Kingdom of God is understood here in terms of forgiveness, compassion and peace where even the demands of justice are postponed in the name of forgiveness. Nonetheless, as history bears out, the space opened by the hope for the Kingdom of God can be a space which is quickly invaded by forces of hate and destruction.

Finally a concern: the overwhelmingly male tone of the discourse in this book is hard to ignore. Teresa of Avilla is given fleeting mention, the absence of the mother in the Prodigal son parable is mentioned (119) and the possibility of thinking God as mother is affirmed (135), but the female principle in any such Kingdom is not thematized. The feminist critique of ‘God the father’ is not mentioned here nor its implications for the account of the Kingdom of God and the basilaic reduction itself.

Kingdoms of God is a pleasure to read. In it a leading contemporary theologian writes in a manner which can only challenge philosophers and theologians engaged in phenomenology’s ongoing encounter with theological and religious thought.