Knowing What to Do: Imagination, Virtue, and Platonism in Ethics

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Timothy Chappell, Knowing What to Do: Imagination, Virtue, and Platonism in Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2014, 339pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199684854.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, Birkbeck, University of London


In this book, Timothy Chappell continues the critical project he developed in Ethics and Experience (2009) where he argued that no conventional systematic moral theory could count as a convincing ethical outlook. His new book, largely based on a series of previously published papers, goes beyond his earlier one to further articulate what a convincing ethical outlook would look like. Chappell's preferred method is exemplification, in particular exemplification of his own ethical outlook. He proceeds in a piecemeal fashion, making contributions to a variety of philosophical debates, including the theory of reasons, demandingness and impartiality, contemporary moral epistemology, and the interpretation of Plato's and Aristotle's ethics. He employs a wide range of expository devices, including passages from poems, plays, novels, memoirs, Wikipedia, world politics, and personal anecdotes. The result is a book that frequently challenges the conventional expectations of a philosophy research monograph (which is how the book is presented). Readers with more selective interests can, however, perfectly well approach this as a collection of independent, but interlocking, arguments and observations.

Chappell's central theme is that there is something fundamentally misguided about the systematic ambitions of contemporary moral philosophy. Following Bernard Williams, he argues against the idea that the conclusions of systematic moral theory have a claim to special normative privilege. Following Alasdair MacIntyre, he argues against the ambitions of those who think that criteria of moral excellence can be defined independently of virtues understood as internal to contingently given practices. Following Ludwig Wittgenstein, he argues that the most important philosophical insights are not gained by constructing theories or giving arguments, but by considering examples, drawing analogies, and issuing reminders.

According to Chappell, systematic moral theory goes wrong in three ways (pp. 2-3). First, systematic moral theory is 'intellectually imperialistic'. Moral theories present themselves as being the whole and exclusive truth about the 'justification, explanation, evaluation, and prescription' of moral beliefs, and as containing the materials for 'displacing or refuting' most or all other systematic moral theories. In so presenting themselves, these theories manifest what Chappell calls 'the curse of the definite article'. In their place, Chappell proposes that we think of different moral theories as being, at least in principle, mutually consistent and complementary. The underlying thought is that moral philosophy should aspire to a form of theoretical pluralism.

Second, systematic moral theories put their details in the wrong place. Standard moral theories come with a highly sophisticated architectonic that permits them to say 'far more than we need them to at just the points where no . . . details are helpful', at the cost of saying little or nothing at the points 'where we most need to examine the phenomena at a finer resolution' (2). One manifestation of this is what Chappell calls (following Williams) the 'one thought too many' problem, which he argues is a common symptom of the failure of systematic moral theory 'to fit the contours of . . . real life' (2).

Third, systematic moral theory is 'motivationally dry' in the sense that it prescribes an excessively detached and impartial perspective on moral thought and action, a perspective from which the basic reasons for caring about morality are too easily lost from view. Thus, Chappell writes, 'We can imagine someone dying for her ideals', but it is 'hard to imagine her dying for overall utility' (2). In place of this detached and impartial perspective, he recommends a theoretical perspective on morality that emphasises lived participatory experience, strong partial commitments, and love.

Chappell's preferred theoretical perspective on morality is based on what he calls 'moral imagination', and the need to develop that imagination in order to gain genuine moral insights. In accord with his methodological commitments, he does not offer a unitary theory of this notion. The moral imagination is a 'polymorphous thing' that works in different ways in different situations. What we are to make of it, however, includes at least the following. First, the successful exercise of moral imagination is an exercise of learning by experience, where the experience in question is as likely to come from reading poetry, fiction, drama and history, or from contemplating nature during the course of a walk in the mountains, as from constructing thought experiments or deductive arguments. Second, the acquisition of moral insight through moral experience is the acquisition of insight into an aspect of reality that is essentially experiential; hence essentially perspectival; hence essentially fugitive with respect to traditional attempts to comprehensively describe it from the detached theoretical perspective of the natural sciences. The resulting philosophical outlook might be described as 'realist', 'intuitionist' and 'virtue theoretic'; so long as we bear in mind the aforementioned caveats about the vices of coercively monolithic philosophical theorising.

There are at least three ways in which philosophers with a preference for systematic moral theory are likely to respond to Chappell's anti-systematic critique. The first, and arguably most significant, is exclusion; for example, by defining away, marginalizing, or just ignoring it. Thus, a systematic moral theorist may try to define away the anti-systematic critique by saying (like some theoretical economists say about the real-world implications of their theories) that hers is just a different project, namely modelling the structure and content of our concepts at some high level of abstraction, thereby gaining a distinctive kind of explanatory illumination of core ideas the 'operationalization' of which in the real world is not at issue (at least not for her, now). Or she may marginalize it by saying that poetically inspired contemplation on the individual case, suggestive lateral thinking, appeals to the enthusiasms of lived ethical experience, and all the rest of it no doubt have their place, but generally fail to achieve the systematicity demanded in 'hard-core' professional philosophy. Or she may just ignore it, because the moral questions raised in the anti-systematic critique fail to correspond to those that people trained in systematic moral theory have learned to think of as the important, or fundamental, questions to ask (e.g., 'Is the good prior to the right?'; 'Is there a viable moral distinction between doing and allowing?'; and all the rest of it).

It is arguably with respect to this response that Chappell's book is most instructive. In a number of places, his non-conventional approach not only serves to illuminate important aspects of moral thought that normally receive little or no attention in systematic moral theory, but also helps to support the claim that these are aspects of moral thought that moral philosophers may want to say more about. One representative case in point is Chappell's discussion of glory as an ethical idea in Chapter 7. In this chapter, he develops an account of what someone could sensibly mean by 'glory' (and one that might be acceptable also to those of a secular mind-set) in terms of a combination of outstanding achievement and recognition. He also helpfully locates this account in the history of moral philosophy from Plato to Sidgwick.

A second response on behalf of systematic moral theory (and perhaps the most familiar in practice) is to absorb. Thus, one might hope to defuse the anti-systematic critique by arguing that the insights of systematic moral theory are consistent with the point of the anti-systematic critique, or that this point can be accommodated by systematic moral theory when properly understood, or that systematic moral theory actually implies, or even explains, this point. (These are strategies frequently seen in responses to radical critiques of liberalism in contemporary political philosophy.) On reflection, Chappell might agree that his anti-systematic critique is a work in progress. He anticipates a number of responses of this kind, which (in at least some cases) he is arguably too quick to dismiss. These include indirect explanations of partial commitments on impartial terms, the distinction between a 'criterion' of rightness and a decision procedure, and variations on these themes. A further consideration is the moral significance of different contexts of deliberation, such as the difference between a single individual deciding whether to give money to a beggar here and now and a multiply layered process of institutional design involving complex resource allocation decisions on the other. It is possible that the appearance of a 'dichotomy' between systematic moral theory and Chappell's anti-systematic critique could be mitigated in some of these ways and more, at least in some cases. But maybe that's not the point. For here, as elsewhere, the question remains what aspects of the relevant issue the moral philosopher should be primarily interested in, and at what cost.

A third response on behalf of systematic moral theory is denial. Thus, it might be thought that the anti-systematic critique can be defused by arguing that the intuitive appeals to 'experience' on the part of the anti-systematic philosopher are generally without probative force because as often as not they are based on prejudice, bias, ignorance, false belief, muddled thinking, or some combination of these. As Chappell notes, there are well known examples of this response in at least some contemporary moral theory, especially in the consequentialist tradition. ('No, babies are not really persons, so if we can kill other sentient beings with impunity, then infanticide is obviously morally OK as well', etc.) But even here, the considered conclusions of systematic theory are not always as radical as is sometimes supposed, at least when 'ideal theory' is applied to 'the real world' (cf. the strategy of absorption above). This quickly moves the discussion on to the question of what we should think and say about what would happen in (more or less) distant possible situations, which then moves us on to a set of further questions about the moral significance of what we should be prepared to think or say. Chappell is arguably right that we don't have easy access to a plausible systematic thinking template to use in evaluating all the relevant counterfactuals here. But then it is not obvious that we have easy access to plausible non-systematic thinking templates to use in thinking about all of them either. One alternative (one that is sometimes associated with the idea of a 'wide reflective equilibrium') is to pursue a mixed approach. Perhaps Chappell's account is compatible with this view.

I once heard a former anthropologist colleague describe her subject as 'an undisciplined discipline'. The implication seemed to be that analytical philosophy is different in this regard. Chappell's approach in this book presents an interesting test case for anyone who wants to think seriously about what succeeding in this aspiration might mean for the contemporary moral philosopher. According to one way of thinking, this aspiration is realised only where the philosophy in question is theoretically systematic. This is the view rejected by Chappell in this book (as it was by Williams and Wittgenstein before him). No one can accuse him of not practicing what he preaches. What some sceptical readers may be more concerned about is whether the expository strategies  Chappell chooses are consistently illuminating in the way that he intends. Perhaps the main concern is that sometimes what is presented as a considered methodological strategy is little more than a sophisticated excuse for personal idiosyncrasy, intellectual whimsy, sloppy argumentation, or intellectual hand-waving. This concern will be familiar to anyone with an interest or stake in the philosophical 'culture wars' that resulted in the continuous division and sub-division of philosophy during the Nineteenth and Twentieth centuries, and that continue to simmer in the early parts of the Twenty-first. Perhaps the study of works like Knowing What to Do can help us to think more clearly about some of this.