Knowledge and Inquiry: Essays on the Pragmatism of Isaac Levi

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Erik J. Olsson (ed.), Knowledge and Inquiry: Essays on the Pragmatism of Isaac Levi, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 400pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521845564.

Reviewed by Paul Weirich, University of Missouri


On the occasion of Isaac Levi's retirement, Erik Olsson collected twenty essays exploring Levi's philosophical ideas, in particular, ideas motivated by Levi's allegiance to pragmatism.  The authors are distinguished philosophers, and their essays insightfully present and assess Levi's views.  The volume begins with Olsson's introduction to the essays and concludes with Levi's replies to them.

A group of essays examines Levi's brand of pragmatism, which rests on C. S. Pierce's belief-doubt model of inquiry.  According to this model, beliefs are the origin of inquiry and change when doubts arise.  Inquiry does not begin with Cartesian doubts that beliefs must overcome.  According to Levi, a person's current beliefs do not need justification.  Only a change in beliefs requires justification.  This type of pragmatism is a type of epistemic conservatism.  Beliefs have epistemic status in virtue of being held and are justifiably retained unless undermined by experience.

Cheryl Misak presents C. S. Peirce's pragmatism.  It involves accepting current beliefs as the start of inquiry and doubting them only for good reason.  Experience may generate changes in belief such as expansion, contraction, and replacement.

André Fuhrmann presents William James's pragmatism.  It distinguishes two types of truth, one relative to the current context and the other absolute.  Inquiry may converge on absolute truth but uses current truth as its guide.  An inquirer changes beliefs in response to experience according to her temperament for belief formation.  Convergence may require that members of the community of inquirers eventually agree in temperament.  Levi holds that an inquirer should seek belief and not permanent belief.

Philip Kitcher elaborates pragmatism so that it encompasses public institutions of knowledge acquisition and dissemination.  He adopts a functional account of belief and explores belief's role in communication.  Reliability of sources facilitates transmission of beliefs, but a pragmatist may sacrifice reliability for informational value.  A pragmatist has an interest in improving rather than grounding current beliefs.  This interest may extend to improvement of public institutions of inquiry.  Kitcher proposes advancing public and not just individual epistemic welfare.  Levi's system addresses primarily an individual inquirer because public systems of inquiry are bound to generate inconsistencies.

Bengt Hansson explicates the distinction between infallibility and incorrigibility.  An infallible belief is maximally certain at the moment.  An incorrigible belief is maximally robust and resistant to change.  A pragmatist may take current beliefs as infallible while acknowledging that they are corrigible.  Hansson, however, thinks that an attractive alternative is to take current beliefs as sufficiently certain and to acknowledge that they are not sufficiently robust.  Levi resists this suggestion.  He holds that belief has no point if it is not absolute certainty.

Erik Olsson in Chapter 11 argues that Levi should distinguish cognitive options and potential answers to a question.  Consider a question about the color of a liquid after a chemical reaction.  A potential answer is red.  Other potential answers are blue and also white.  However, if evidence is incomplete, a reasonable cognitive option may be belief that the color is red or blue.  Levi calls that cognitive option a potential answer.  He maintains that clarifying terminology prevents confusing his sense of potential answer with other senses of the term.

Sven Hansson notes that a theory of rationality employs two types of idealization.  One type simplifies and the other type presents goals that rational agents aspire to attain.  Probabilism offers an account of the doxastic states of cognitively unlimited agents.  However, the behavior of ideal agents may not guide the behavior of nonideal agents.  Accounts of belief change formulate goals for cognitively limited agents.

Levi's pragmatism concerning belief leaves some issues unresolved.  For instance, the type of justification he provides for belief change does not address the reliability of perception.  He takes reliance on perception to be a matter of routine and attends mainly to deliberative methods of belief change.  The view that current beliefs do not need justification also raises several questions.  It leaves unexplained our attempts to gather evidence to test and support current beliefs.

Another group of essays addresses Levi's account of belief change.  By belief, Levi means certainty.  An agent holds current beliefs to be infallible but not incorrigible.  Levi's principles of belief change respect epistemic entrenchment and informational economy.  For example, beliefs at the core of a corpus of knowledge are the last to be abandoned when an agent confronts evidence challenging her beliefs.  Levi calls his principle for removing beliefs "mild contraction".

Otávio Bueno argues that accounts of belief change gain realism and versatility by adopting a paraconsistent logic that allows for contained inconsistencies.  A useful theory need not be true.  An inconsistency need not be damaging to a theory that makes no claim to express the truth.

Maurice Pagnucco compares two accounts of abduction.  One takes abduction as identification of potential answers to an inquiry.  The other takes abduction as consistent explanation of observations.  Only the first is abduction in the traditional sense.  The second is a form of induction.  Both abduction and induction have significant roles in belief change.

Hans Rott examines Levi''s mild-contraction method of belief removal.  It yields the same results as a method of contraction that Rott and Pagnucco introduce and call "severe withdrawal".  Levi's motivation for mild contraction applies decision theory to the promotion of informational value.  Rott and Pagnucco's motivation for severe withdrawal relies on axiomatic principles of belief change.  Rott believes that Levi does not provide enough detail about informational value to support his arguments for mild contraction and adopts too many constraints on contraction.  According to Rott, severe withdrawal is just one of several sensible methods of contraction.

Horacio Arló Costa favors mild contraction because it has suitable regard for entrenched beliefs.  His main project is to propose appropriate standards for sequences of changes in belief.  The sequences may appear in nested conditionals or may appear in the dynamics of actual belief changes.  Levi holds that the changing context of beliefs during the course of time authorizes radical changes in belief.  It is therefore hard to identify interesting constraints on the dynamics of actual beliefs.

Taking belief to be absolute certainty makes beliefs rare.  People are absolutely certain of very few propositions.  Levi holds that belief has no role if it is not absolute certainty.  However, belief has a role in communication among cognitively limited agents even if it does not express absolute certainty.  Taking it as absolute certainty is at best a simplifying idealization.  For instance, models of inference are simpler if beliefs are certainties.

A third group of essays discusses Levi's views about credal probability.  This is probability resting on beliefs.  Beliefs are in flux, and after each belief change, credal probabilities arise anew.  Conditionalization fails because beliefs may change radically.  A proposition assigned minimum probability at one time may receive maximum probability at another time.  Beliefs may fail to generate determinate probabilities.  When probabilities are indeterminate, a set of probability assignments representing them is convex.  If two probability assignments in the set assign different probability values to a proposition, then for every probability value between those different values some assignment in the set accords that value to the proposition.

Nils-Eric Sahlin distinguishes outcome risks and epistemic risks.  The latter arise from ignorance about the former.  Consuming genetically modified food, for instance, may involve an epistemic risk because of its unknown long term consequences.  Indeterminate probabilities and utilities of possible outcomes generate epistemic risks.  The precautionary principle, although vague, licenses regulations to reduce epistemic risks.

Henry Kyburg argues that admissible probability assignments need not form a convex set.  One may know that a coin is either biased for Tails or biased for Heads so that the admissible assignments for Heads are just 0.4 and 0.6.  Convexity adds the assignment 0.5 although it is inadmissible.

D. H. Mellor takes chances to be propensities, that is, dispositions that manifest themselves in relative frequencies of outcomes of endlessly repeated chance set-ups.  The dispositions are place holders for their categorical non-chance bases.  His account of chance grounds direct inference from knowledge of chances to degrees of belief concerning the outcomes of chance set-ups.

Wolfgang Spohn uses ranking functions to elucidate the structural similarities of probability assignments and belief changes.  He does not claim that these functions provide a common reductive base for probabilities and belief changes, however.  Theories of probability and belief may be separate.  There may be no bridge principles governing the interaction of probabilities and beliefs.  As the lottery paradox shows, the relation between probabilities and beliefs is vexed.

Erik Olsson in Chapter 12 analyzes the lottery paradox and draws some conclusions about knowledge from it.  Because knowledge has a social role, a person should not assert that he knows that his lottery ticket will not win.  Other more cautious people in his epistemic position may not draw the same negative conclusion.  Hence he is not entitled to claim knowledge that his ticket will not win.

Mark Kaplan argues that probabilities express the force of epistemic considerations, whereas attributions of knowledge blend epistemic and pragmatic considerations.  You may not regard yourself as knowing that P if at the same time you are unwilling to act as if P.  Hence in a context where the stakes are low, one may self-attribute knowledge that P, whereas in another epistemically identical context where the stakes are high, one may withdraw the attribution.  Assertions of knowledge require taking account of the pragmatic circumstances of others and do not rest solely on evidence.  On page 230, Kaplan observes that Levi's account of belief expansion neglects all goals except cognitive goals, such as informational value, and so gives cognitive goals absolute priority over all other goals.  Also, using informational value to justify adding a belief, taken as a certainty, uses pragmatic rather than epistemic reasons to boost a proposition's probability.

Wlodek Rabinowicz refines diachronic pragmatic arguments for the principles of conditionalization, reflection, and transitivity of preferences.  The refinements accommodate foresight and sophisticated choice.  They use persistent bookies and persistent offers.  Although the refinements do not settle the rationality of following the principles, they escape common objections to the pragmatic arguments for the principles.  In general, the pragmatic arguments exhibit ways that people may be exploited if they make decisions in a piecemeal rather than a unified way.

According to Levi, whether an agent's inquiry should culminate in accepting a hypothesis h depends on the expected epistemic value for the agent of believing that h.  Suppose that QK assigns for the agent a credal probability of a hypothesis according to her current corpus of knowledge, a is the agent's degree of caution in belief formation, and Va assigns for the agent an epistemic value with respect to a of believing a hypothesis given a truth value for it.  Then the following formula expresses the agent's expected epistemic value with respect to a of believing h.

EVa(h) = QK(h) • Va(h, true) +  QK(~h) • Va(h, false)

Rival hypotheses have expected epistemic values also.  An agent should accept h only if the expected epistemic value of believing h is at least as great as the expected epistemic value of believing any rival hypothesis.

If probabilities guide action but rest on beliefs adjusted to promote informational value, then cognitive goals are double counted.  They count once in adjustments of beliefs and a second time in decisions about action.  Action thus accords excessive weight to an agent's cognitive goals.  An agent who follows Levi's principle of expansion may be exploited as a result.  Suppose, for example, that she boosts from 0.8 to 1.0 the probability of a hypothesis because accepting the hypothesis maximizes expected epistemic value in light of the hypothesis's high informational value.  Before accepting the hypothesis, she may sell for $0.80 a ticket that pays a dollar if the hypothesis is true and otherwise nothing.  After accepting the hypothesis, she may buy back the ticket for $1.00.  She loses $0.20 from these transactions.  The selling and repurchasing indicate a preference reversal that occurs without any change in basic goals or evidence.  The combination of transactions is irrational.

Probabilities should represent strength of evidence and should not be influenced by cognitive goals such as informational value.  Letting pragmatic considerations influence beliefs that in turn influence probabilities makes probabilities unreliable guides to action.  If probabilities are to guide action well, probabilities that have purely epistemic grounding should replace the credal probabilities that appear in Levi's system of pragmatically grounded belief change and probability assignments resting on updated beliefs.

Letting informational value guide belief change appears to create a form of wishful thinking.  One accepts a hypothesis one would like to believe because of its informational value.  Pragmatically grounded beliefs may, however, serve a useful role in communication between cognitively limited agents.  Assertions of belief condense prohibitively expensive communication about probabilities and utilities.  Also, pragmatically grounded beliefs may usefully guide the acts of cognitively limited agents in circumstances where probabilistic analysis has unjustified costs.  The simplification may yield some misguided acts, but may also yield on average a balanced response to epistemic and pragmatic considerations.  One may acknowledge pragmatic considerations in a theory of belief formation but should not let any beliefs other than evidential beliefs control probability assignments.

A last group of essays addresses psychology and dispositions.  Wolfram Hinzen considers the psychology of belief change.  He advocates naturalizing normative theories of belief change so that they may predict and explain behavior.

Akeel Bilgrami holds that dispositions have a categorical base and are nonnormative, whereas commitments are normative because they involve agency, intentionality, and a first-person perspective.  Mental health requires dispositions and commitments to be in agreement, and psychoanalysis promotes their agreement.  In his reply, Levi explains his view of commitments.  He holds that they are not moral commitments, may obtain even if meeting them is beyond an agent's capabilities, and are not such that an agent's failure to meet them entails the agent's acceptance of criticism.

Johannes Persson compares Levi's account of dispositions with Jon Elster's account of dispositions.  He finds that dispositions according to Levi are surefire and fit into laws, whereas according to Elster they are not surefire and yield mechanisms producing effects.  Dispositions as Levi sees them yield etiological explanations of why events occur, whereas dispositions as Elster sees them yield constitutive explanations of how events occur.

This book treats important topics in epistemology and metaphysics, and its essays uniformly reach a high level of scholarship.  Theorists in philosophy, computer science, and psychology will profit from reading it thoroughly.