Knowledge and Politics in Plato's Theaetetus

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Paul Stern, Knowledge and Politics in Plato's Theaetetus, Cambridge, 2008, 315pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521884297.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto



Apart from the Parmenides, there is probably no other Platonic dialogue so densely packed with philosophical arguments as the Theaetetus. The dialogue is at once elegantly simple in its basic structure and extraordinarily complex in its details. The question “what is knowledge?” (epistēmē) is posed by Socrates to the young and precocious Theaetetus. He offers a succession of answers to this question: (1) knowledge is sense-perception; (2) knowledge is true belief; (3) knowledge is true belief plus a logos or account. Socrates refutes all three definitions. The dialogue ends in aporia or a roadblock. No additional answer is forthcoming. In an epilogue, we are told that Socrates then goes off to the portico of the King Archon to meet the indictment of him by Meletus. The Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, and Phaedo carry the story on to its well-known conclusion.

It is not difficult to understand why Myles Burnyeat in the preface to his excellent monograph on the Theaetetus would say that in that work, “I found a work of philosophy that would reward a lifetime’s study”. Not only Plato scholars but even those with little enthusiasm for the history of philosophy generally have found in this dialogue manifold riches worthy of the most minute scrutiny. One reason for this is, no doubt, that the third definition of knowledge is thought by some either to be basically correct or at least to show the way to what in the latter part of the last century came to be known as “the standard analysis” of knowledge as “justified true belief”. Here, one might suppose, is one part or aspect of Plato’s philosophy that remains of vital contemporary interest. Along the way to this definition and what is perhaps its puzzling rejection, there are arguments on relativism, skepticism, perception, infallibility, memory, belief, truth — in short, virtually the entire panoply of topics found in a typical undergraduate course in epistemology offered in the analytic mode.

There is, as is well-known, one portion of the dialogue (172B-177C), explicitly called by Socrates a “digression”, that does not obviously fit nicely into the lucid argumentative structure. This is the passage in which Socrates contrasts the lives of philosophers with the lives of orators, and offers the portentous and extremely influential exhortation to “flee from the evils here below” and to “assimilate oneself to the divine”, an assimilation that is identified with the practice of virtue. The oddness of this passage can certainly be overstated, an error that sometimes leads to its being completely ignored as irrelevant to the main epistemological themes of the dialogue. In line with texts in the Gorgias, Symposium, Republic, and Phaedo, neither the contrast between philosophers and their counterfeits, nor the pronouncement of the otherworldliness of the philosopher’s vocation are particularly surprising. Yet the clear normative dimension that this “digression” gives to the Theaetetus can hardly be ignored.

Paul Stern has written an extended commentary on this dialogue, one which is presented as a new interpretation. By “new” I do not mean that he gives us a fresh analysis of one or more of the perhaps dozen distinct and extended arguments in the work. I mean really new. New in the sense that no one to my knowledge has ever before argued that the Theaetetus is not focused on the question “what is knowledge?” but is rather devoted to what Stern calls “the political-ethical meaning” of knowledge. According to Stern, addressing the “problem of knowledge” requires conversation (by Socrates and his interlocutors) about “the political things” (67). The word “epistemology” only appears once in the book, in a typically incomprehensible passage: “[Theaetetus] desires epistemology, a science of how we know what we know. Such a science might provide irrefutable knowledge of knowledge, an unassailable warrant for its veracity” (113-14). Socrates, Stern assures us, will respond to this misplaced desire throughout the dialogue. The word “epistemological” appears a couple of times, too, but with scare quotes (118, 171), though I confess I do not see what Stern is getting at here, other than that the dialogue is really not about epistemology at all. Given Stern’s grasp of what epistemology is, I suppose that conclusion is not surprising.

For Stern, the question “what is knowledge?”, which the dialogue explicitly addresses, is irrelevant or too easy to require addressing, or unsuitably connected to the political slant that he is determined to see as the main thrust of the dialogue. So, instead, we discover that the Theaetetus is actually devoted to “the meaning and possibility of knowledge” (1, 3, 55), “the requirements of knowing” (10), “how we really do come to know” (11), “the being of wholes, especially, the human whole” (21, 27, 43), “the practical need to know a human being”, “what kind of knowledge we should seek” (36), “the kind of knowledge available regarding the soul” (48), “self knowledge” (81, 165), “the human good” (119, 131), “the proper meaning of wisdom” (155), “the character of that knowledge that is the ultimate goal of inquiry” (161), and “the problem of relating wholes to parts” (176). I may have missed some of Stern’s glosses on the simple question posed by Socrates at 145E9 (cf. 146C3): “what is knowledge?” Nevertheless, it is clear that Stern is determined to disregard the plain sense of the question guiding the entire dialogue. For from Socrates’ refutation of (1) above, comes (2) which is supposed to be an improvement. When (2) is refuted, (3) is proposed as yet another improvement. It is hard to think of a Platonic dialogue that has a more transparent dialectical structure. Yet for Stern, a study of the central question and the path of arguments in relation to the carefully graded steps of the definitions is beside the point. The real point of the dialogue is the promotion of Socratic philosophy, a thoroughly political philosophy centered on the “human things”. I will return in a moment to the idea of the Theaetetus as a vehicle for Socratic philosophy.

First, though, it should be clear that Stern is not saying that there are political implications to things said in the dialogues. Apart from the banality of such a claim, one might wonder whether Stern is more concerned with the political implications for himself rather than for Plato’s readers. On the contrary, Stern is absolutely convinced that the dialogue is primarily about politics and that those pesky little arguments about “epistemology” and shall we say “metaphysics” are only window dressing for the political lesson that Stern knows Socrates is delivering. Some who read this book without having a thorough familiarity with the Theaetetus might suppose that it is at least conceivable that Stern has unearthed hitherto undiscovered phrases or references in the dialogue that indicate to the astute reader the true dimensions of the work. Such a one will be surprised to learn that the Greek words for “state” or for “political affairs” occur only a handful of times in the dialogue and with one exception they occur in examples Socrates offers in refutation of Protagorean relativism. He does this because relativism (along with Heracliteanism) is apparently a necessary assumption for making good the definition of knowledge as sense-perception, according to the criteria laid down at 152C5-6 that knowledge must be (a) of what is and (b) infallible or unerring. Refute relativism and a crucial support for that definition is taken away. So, Socrates points out that if relativism is true, then states or those who comprise them are the infallible judges of what is in their interests. Since this is obviously false, relativism at least in regard to political matters seems to be false. Socrates also offers numerous examples of the relativism of individual or personal judgments, and argues similarly that even those who claim to be experts with regard to their own well-being cannot but admit that they are not infallible in this regard.

So, the two obvious points to conclude are that the mention of politics in these passages is not intended to be the central theme here — much less for the entire dialogue — and that one reason that definition (1) fails is that it cannot meet the criterion of infallibility. Stern nicely sums up his confusion on both points when he says that in Socrates’ move from the refutation of (1) to the discussion of (2), the definition of knowledge as true belief or opinion, “Socrates begins to map his home base, the realm of opinion, which is preeminently the political realm” (215). Is it necessary to point out that even if for Plato the realm of opinion is the political realm, it does not follow that an examination of the definition of knowledge as true belief amounts to a thematization of the political? Even if the political is “Socrates’ home base”, Stern has completely missed the reason why (1) fails, namely, that sense-perception is not an infallible guide to the truth. Indeed, Stern avers on behalf of Socrates that knowledge cannot be much more than a “well-informed guess” (75). He also confidently insists that Socrates “is at pains to distinguish the desire to know from the desire for certainty, his own way of life from that of the philosopher” (295). If this were so, then it really would be puzzling why Socrates would reject the definition of knowledge as true belief. It is pretty clear that Stern cannot even imagine taking seriously the infallibility criterion for knowledge. But it is one thing to argue, as many philosophers have, against such a criterion. It is another to argue that Plato could not hold this view. Finally, it veers into the surreal to suggest that Plato could not hold this view in the Theaetetus because Socrates is a political philosopher and political philosophers do not deal in certainties.

Early on in the dialogue, Socrates gets Theaetetus to agree that knowledge is identical with wisdom (sophia) (145E6). The synonymous use of the two terms is carried through the rest of the dialogue (cf. 201A4-7). There is another term for wisdom, phronēsis, which is used only twice in the dialogue, apparently synonymously with sophia; hence, it, too, is identical with knowledge. The term phronēsis does sometimes have a practical or ethical connotation, though much more clearly so in Aristotle than in Plato. It is apparently this ethical (hence, for Stern, political) connotation that the author clings to, for though he rejects the property of infallibility for knowledge, he completely avoids all the obvious places in the text where this property is assumed. So, since Socrates is intent only on conveying a lesson about political philosophy, and this lesson is supposed to flow from Socrates’ wisdom, Stern concocts the fantasy that Socrates distinguishes knowledge and wisdom, though at one point he allows that the distinction between knowledge and wisdom by Socrates is “implied” (33, 119). The reason for this is that “[o]ne can be wise even without the possessing comprehensive and certain knowledge” (264). Somewhat bewildering, then, is Stern’s conclusion that

Socrates is at pains to distinguish the desire to know from the desire for certainty, his own way of life from that of the philosopher. In this distinction, which is ultimately one between wisdom and knowledge, resides Socrates’ deepest defense against the charge of dogmatism. (295)

I am afraid that I am unable to untangle the word “know” in the first sentence which seems to be used synonymously with the word “wisdom” in the second sentence, which is contrasted with “knowledge”. What is clear, however, is that, according to Stern, all “dogmatisms” are to be avoided by the cognoscenti, including, I guess, the dogmatism that consists in fidelity to the text.

This brings me to what we might term the hermeneutical tensions in Stern’s approach. For that approach aims single-mindedly to reveal the Theaetetus as a work of Socratic political philosophy. Stern only barely acknowledges that the Socrates to which he, like everyone else, has access is the literary character of Plato’s dialogues. Stern makes no appeal to any evidence for Socrates’ views apart from the dialogue itself; he only mentions in a desultory fashion some of the other dialogues. So, either “Socratic political philosophy” is “Platonic political philosophy” or not. Let us assume, on Stern’s behalf, that one can distinguish these, and suppose that in the Theaetetus that Socratic political philosophy is what Plato is representing. Apart from the embarrassment that Socrates in this dialogue expresses no political opinions (unless we include his exhortation to the virtuous life in imitation of divinity), there is the much more fundamental problem that Socrates, like any literary character, is available to us only through the words and deeds that the author, Plato, puts in his mouth. “Socrates” is a literary character; he has no secret thoughts, he has no shoe size, he has no hidden desires. He cannot lie or deceive, unless the author indicates somehow that he is doing so. All this would hardly be worth mentioning were it not for the fact that Stern repeatedly tells us what Socrates really means, is getting at, intends, aims to do, is at pains to do, or earnestly desires for himself and his interlocutors, etc. For example, at the end of the digression, Socrates asks Theodorus to return to their previous discussion of (1) above “if that seems good to you”. Here is Stern’s remark on these words:

The quoted phrase can also be translated, “if it is so resolved,” the phrase used in passing laws in the assembly. Socrates undertakes to legislate for their little community. After reiterating his preference for long speeches, and appealing once again to his age, Theodorus agrees, saying ‘if it seems good, let’s go back (177C4-5)‘. Theodorus subordinates his good to that of the community. He thereby makes possible the common good of philosophic conversation. Theodorus acts justly. (184-5)

Another example. Stern claims that in the digression wherein philosophers are distinguished from orators, Socrates is not to be counted among the philosophers, precisely because these philosophers are “otherworldly” (162-82). According to Stern, Socrates judges philosophers deficient in self-knowledge. This is a surprising thing to claim, given that Plato wrote this dialogue. But in any case, the evidence that philosophers are deficient in self-knowledge is that philosophers do not even “know that they do not know these things [viz., the ways of the city, the location of public buildings, the texts of laws, political cliques, genealogies, etc.]” (173). Stern insists, for obvious reasons, that Socrates is not one of these philosophers. Is Plato? One might think so. More to the point, Stern is committed to the view that Plato represents Socrates as being opposed to the otherworldly philosophers, for example, that philosopher in the Phaedo named “Socrates”, who argues that philosophy is a preparation for dying and being dead. Let us grant this very strange claim. It is true that Socrates, as Plato describes him elsewhere, does not fit the picture of one who does not know the way to the central market of Athens. If one takes this approach, however, then how exactly are we to access the political philosophy of the (non-Platonic) Socrates? According to Stern,

in opposition to his own philosophic concern for that which is good, beautiful, and just, Socrates portrays the philosopher as otherworldly and apolitical, ignorant, or neglectful of the transitory, particular, and so, trivial affairs of humans. (163)

So, Socrates’ political philosophy is now to be characterized as a concern for the good, beautiful and just. If Stern has a way to distinguish the lineaments of Socrates’ concern for these things from Plato’s he does not share it with the readers. For after all, Plato’s concerns for these (in the mouth of the Socrates of the Republic) is manifested in the otherworldly education of the philosophers who only go back, reluctantly, into political life after decades of training.

One more example must suffice. The Theaetetus actually begins with a brief prologue in which the philosopher Euclides of Megara and a friend, one Terpsion, meet on the street in their home town (142A-143C). Euclides recounts his meeting with the mortally wounded Theaetetus, who at his own request is being carried back to his home in Athens from a battle in Corinth. Euclides tells Terpsion that he recalls hearing from Socrates a conversation that he had with the young Theaetetus some months before his trial and execution. Terpsion urges Euclides to repeat the conversation. Then, we are taken back to that time in 399 B.C.E. when Socrates met the mathematician Theodorus of Cyrene who tells him about the mathematical prodigy Theaetetus who, as it happens, is coming towards them. Then, the main dialogue begins. Stern sees in the prologue an obvious political theme. This prologue “ensures that the specter of politically hued deaths [those of Theaetetus and Socrates] hovers over the subsequent proceedings” (2). This “hovering” is confirmed by the conclusion of the dialogue — Socrates’ remark that he is off to answer the charge against him — and the digression. Stern concedes that the political meaning of the digression, in the context of the entire dialogue seems “anomalous”, though in the same sentence he adds that "Plato does undeniably place the political character of the Theaetetus squarely before us" (4). In the next paragraph, he acknowledges that Theodorus and Theaetetus “resist the invitation to reflect on the dialogue’s political themes”. I have been struggling with the question of whose invitation this is supposed by Stern to be? Surely, he could not mean the “invitation” of Euclides and Terpsion who are depicted as meeting probably eight or so years (not 30 as Stern has it) after Socrates’ death at the time of the death of the young Theaetetus. Is it Plato’s invitation? If so, why does he have his characters resist it? But Stern says that they too resist the invitation, meaning presumably that Socrates resists it as well. My best guess is that it is in fact Stern who has invited himself to engage in a faux analysis of the text in order to discern a meaning that he, Stern, has already decided must be there. As he says, “it is in light of this problem [of knowledge] that we should understand the permanent need for political inquiry as a guide for philosophy” (297).

One of the more puzzling themes in this book is that of “partial knowledge”. This is repeated many, many times throughout the book without explanation, sometimes in conjunction with the idea of “knowledge of wholes”. Until I got to page 218, I guessed that “partial knowledge” referred to the passage at 201C-202C in which Socrates, in the context of a consideration of (3) above, tries to make sense of this definition by suggesting that he has had a “dream” according to which elements of some whole are not knowable, though the whole might be. The whole would be knowable because its parts could be listed; obviously, the parts or elements could not be so known. Socrates has a rather easy time showing that the logos that turns true belief into knowledge cannot be this. What puzzled me is that this argument is localized and specifically related to the definition of knowledge as true belief plus a logos. Yet Stern seems to take “partial knowledge”, something that this “dream” rejects, as a central theme of the dialogue. As it turns out, we learn that by “partial knowledge” Stern actually means “opinion” or “belief” (216, n.1). Under “opinion” he means to include false opinion among cases of partial knowledge (237). I’m afraid I simply have no idea what it means to say that a false opinion is partial knowledge. Is it equivalent to “partial credit” on an exam given for effort? As for true opinion, its “partiality”, as Stern puts it, means either (a) knowledge about human affairs (i.e., political knowledge), which is partial presumably because it leaves out eternal matters, or (b) the knowledge of one’s own ignorance that Socrates possesses (217). I do not quite see how (a) and (b) go together, though perhaps this is because the study of “human things” (no more than the exposition of that study) is so deep. In any case, according to Stern it turns out, it seems, that the moral of the Theaetetus is the centrality of political knowledge which is, in fact, a sort of belief, and this is so despite the rejection by Socrates of the definition of knowledge as true belief and the definition of knowledge as true belief plus a logos. Somehow Socrates’ claim to be ignorant of these matters is precisely what that partial knowledge amounts to.

There is nothing in this book — obviously the product of considerable thought and a dutiful, though highly circumscribed, foray into the secondary literature — about knowledge, that is, about epistēmē either as this is revealed in the argument of the Theaetetus or as Plato presents it elsewhere. Perhaps Stern and others will maintain that casting aside these arguments was necessary to get at the real (partial?) truth being conveyed in this dialogue. There is, however, not a single argument in this book to demonstrate this. Nor is there any indication that Stern has the slightest idea why Plato thought that knowledge was problematic. Let us stipulate that there are plenty of good books on the epistemological dimensions of the Theaetetus and that Stern did not fail his readers in writing another. But surely we deserve to have been given something of substance regarding the “human things” or the “good” that Stern endlessly insists is what underlies virtually every passage in this dialogue. In fact, he never does get around to telling us what he thinks Socrates thinks this good actually is. Just that it is deep, very deep.