Knowledge, Dexterity, and Attention: A Theory of Epistemic Agency

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Abrol Fairweather and Carlos Montemayor, Knowledge, Dexterity, and Attention: A Theory of Epistemic Agency, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 196 pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107089822.

Reviewed by Mohan Matthen, University of Toronto


Mika examines a urine sample under a microscope and reports that she has found a high level of red blood cells. Does she know that the patient has microscopic haematuria? Which is more fundamental for deciding this: that Mika is a competent technician who is well-trained and possesses acute eyesight, good technique, and long experience of her specialty and that she acts accordingly, or that her observation of this sample was meticulous? Traditionally, most epistemologists found it natural to choose the latter option. Mika's examination produced knowledge because it was well suited to find out the truth. Her disposition to observe well on other occasions is irrelevant to whether she knows on this occasion -- though, of course, it might be relevant to whether the recipient of her report trusts her, and to whether this recipient can claim to know that the patient has haematuria.

In this authoritative, wide-ranging, densely reasoned, empirically sensitive, and insightful study, Abrol Fairweather and Carlos Montemayor go the other way. In common with other "virtue epistemologists," they hold that knowledge depends on the exercise of epistemic virtue, or, in other words, on the "normative cognitive dispositional properties" of the observer (13-14). Mika's conclusions rise to the status of knowledge because of her skill, the exercise of which ensures that this observation is due to her agency, and the excellence of which ensures reliability. The authors' goal in this book is to construct a substantive theory of knowledge that shows what kinds of agent-dispositions produce reliable belief non-fortuitously.

Note that this way of motivating virtue epistemology is missing one element that is important in Aristotelian virtue ethics, namely affect. Aristotle insisted that the best acts are not just performed reliably and for the right reasons, but also with the right kinds of emotional affect. The best act of generosity, for example, is performed warm-heartedly. The epistemologist does not have this kind of consideration to appeal to; whatever its plausibility in the ethical domain, affect is irrelevant in epistemology. Mika may or may not love the truth, but her actions are no more or less creditworthy for that.

I have deliberately chosen a laboratory skill to illustrate virtue epistemology, though, in the main, the authors discuss only reasoning. My reason is that a good observer deploys bodily and perceptual skills at a level of analysis that is irrelevant to reasoning. When a technician conducts a skilled examination, she intends her action at one level (e.g., 'Bring the sample into clear focus') but realizes the action at another level -- by the fine motion of her hands, for example. Her dextrous movements when conducting an examination of this sort are not chosen or controlled under any conceptual description. (This is generally true of bodily action. I choose to walk across the room; I don't choose and control the precise motions of my feet, and have no intention with respect to them other than that they should serve my intention to walk across the room.) This makes a dispositional analysis more plausible; Mika doesn't intend her fine motor and perceptual actions -- her intentions are formulated more abstractly. The classic rational belief-formation problems that virtue epistemologists focus on are prima facie a less fertile field for this kind of explanation. Johnna is a fine meta-logician who constructs elegant investigations of logic systems -- it's not clear why anybody thinks that this "virtue" has explanatory priority over the mental process by which she constructs a proof on a specific occasion. For these reasons, I was particularly interested in how virtue epistemology works in areas where knowledge-seeking is not easily captured in explicit theoretical or practical reasoning. (There is a significant overlap here with the authors' discussion of integrated automatic processes in chapter 4.)

With this distinction between intention and execution in mind, let me review some central points of the authors' virtue epistemology.

First, the claim, as recounted above, is that dispositions (or skills) are better guarantors of non-fortuitous action than any particular intention. Let's pursue this with a somewhat more extreme case than that of Mika, the microscopist. Carrie is a fine judge of character. When she declares somebody to be honest, you can bet he is. But it is very difficult to pin Carrie's methods down. Her reasoning is holistic, contextual, and non-monotonic to the nth degree. You can't ascribe any explicit reasoning to her; she simply reads people, using the very same indications that the rest of us employ, albeit with more success. (She doesn't rely on occult powers of divination.) Since there's not a lot more to be said about her success than that she has excellent judgement, we can only explain her performance by her general skill. Some might think that this is a case that supports disposition-based epistemology. the authors write: "An epistemically virtuous agent will reliably form a reliable epistemic motivation" (24). Carrie is just such an agent.

The worry is that the case supports a disposition-based psychology, but it's not clear what it does for epistemology. Ex hypothesi, Carrie's disposition reveals very little about her reasoning in particular cases. Often, she says something startlingly on the right track. For instance, you think Harry is dishonest, but Carrie explains that you have misunderstood the interactions on which you are basing your judgment. This illustrates her perspicacity, but it is post facto--Carrie can't account for how she arrives at her conclusions; her "reliable epistemic motivation" can't readily be conceptualized.

Now, what is the ontological status of her perspicacity? It can't merely be a conditional fact -- the fact that when Carrie encounters personal situation, she most often reads it correctly. It can't be this, because this conditional merely describes and does not cause or explain her judgement. It must be something ontologically more independent; something that underlies the conditional fact and causes it -- lacking better terminology, let's call it a power. If epistemic virtues are not powers, they would merely be conditional behaviours, and this would defeat the very point of putting virtue first.

Here comes the difficulty. The very same power -- however you individuate mental powers -- that led her to read Harry so well sometimes leads Carrie into error. She insists that Thomas is a very courageous man, but she's over-estimating him. She has blind spots. Now, how does her epistemic excellence help us here? It seems odd to say that it excuses this mistake; conversely, her occasional errors don't gainsay her successes. Still, we have no good way to make explicit her reasoning in particular cases. So, it's hard to say whether she knows the truth about Harry. Of course, an observer might be inclined to trust Carrie because he has so often seen her get things right. But the fact remains that the rationality of her judgement on any particular occasion is not decided by her dispositions. True, her actual mental process doesn't help either, since this may be opaque even to herself. But this does not help the virtue-theorist. In summary, then, the very irreducibility of explanation by powers undercuts the availability of knowledge judgements and undercuts its utility to epistemology.

Though Mika's case is different, I am inclined to say the same of her. In her case, there are two levels of analysis. At the level of intention, she exercises truth-conducive rules. Microscopy is not all that mysterious; we can figure out what these rules are. At the level of execution, she translates these rules into dextrous eye-hand coordination. This dexterity, though it is necessary for proper execution, is not chosen under any conceptual description. This does not, as the authors rightly insist (6), preclude dextrous bodily movement from being "agential" -- see section 4.1 for an excellent analysis. Nonetheless, reason-giving plays out at the level of intention, not bodily execution. The authors are right to say that "the automaticity of a process in an agent is actually an indication of success and creditworthiness" (6), and this is right, but the fact remains that rationality resides in intention, not execution. So, here too, there's no reason to think that virtue is normatively more fundamental than performance.

So, there are three kinds of cases. Johnna the logician reasons explicitly, and we evaluate each of her proofs on its own merits, not Johnna's. Mika's dexterity cannot be codified, but it does not determine rationality; her use of good method, on the other hand, is evaluable in individual performances. Finally, Carrie: her epistemic virtue is irreducibly responsible for her success, but it doesn't help us decide whether she knows.

Second, I am uncomfortable in this context with the notion of an epistemic norm or value. Stewart Cohen (2016) observes that "if your child is critically ill, you are morally obligated to investigate the various options for treatment." But he says that it is "ludicrous to suppose" that there is a general obligation to attain the truth. You have no obligation to memorize the phone book. I take it that Cohen is thinking of external obligations: the parent must do everything he can to make his child better; therefore, he ought to research the treatment options. You have no obligation to memorize the phone book; you have not erred by leaving it unperused. These oughts follow from external, i.e. non-epistemic, moral duties. They don't tell us anything about epistemic norms or values.

The authors disagree with this assessment. "To form a belief is to commit to being subject to epistemic norms, whether the content is trivial or not," they write (70). But this doesn't seem germane: true, you are subject to certain standards if you decide to form a belief, but that doesn't mean that you are subject to epistemic norms in all inquiry. The imperative, "If you seek belief, then do this," breaks up into two parts -- first, whether to seek belief, and, second, what course of action most reliably produces true belief. The former is not an epistemic question; the latter is purely factual and non-normative. Even more tellingly, there is sometimes a positive obligation not to seek the truth -- you have a (defeasible) duty not to snoop on the people who live next door. In the service of prohibited truth-seeking, resourcefulness and diligence are not commendable. Recall Aristotle: you can't commit adultery with the right person in the right way at the right time.

The parent in Cohen's example, his would-be telephonist, and Mika the microscopist have differently based obligations. None of these rest on the unconditional value of rational inquiry. As I understand him, Cohen is pointing out a difference between (a) norms that dictate how one should act in epistemic situations, and (b) norms that arise from the very nature of knowledge, belief, and other epistemic achievements. (On this point, see also Kauppinen, forthcoming.) I am inclined to think that the canons of truth-revealing inquiry fall under (a), not (b). The authors say that cognitive integration and attention to relevant evidence are cognitive norms (34), and that distracting mental influences are "normatively significant failure(s)." In my view, attention to evidence and similar rules of inquiry are good for discovering the truth, but not good unconditionally.

Are there norms of type (b), which arise from the nature of knowledge itself? Timothy Williamson (2000) claims that you should believe only what you know. ("The point of belief is knowledge," 1.) This is a putative example of such a norm -- it's an epistemic norm if it's a norm at all -- but it's hard for me to see how it is relevant to virtue epistemology, which seems to be more concerned with the "how" of inquiry, the methods and dispositions that bring success, not success itself.

Now, the authors are aware of considerations such as those that bother Cohen. For instance, they quote Philippa Foot saying that one can judge that x is a good doctor without having a reason to choose x (62), and they suggest (again following Foot) that the gap is bridged by an interest or desire: "Attentional states . . . select environmental targets and recruit guidance activity relevant to some current aim. . . Any cognitive system with selective attention is thereby answerable to an internal norm." (63, my emphasis)

To me, this is unconvincing for two reasons. First, I may have a desire, or even an interest, in finding out what your bank balance is, but this does not make it commendable in any way for me to use the most effective methods in order to find this out. For as Niko Kolodny and John Brunero (2016) observe (crediting Jay Wallace 2001), "it seems possible for one to have some akratic end while failing to see anything even pro tanto good about it, or any reason to pursue it" (my emphasis). Snooping into your private affairs does not have normative force even if I intend (against my better self) to find out your bank balance. Second, bracketing moral praise or censure, think of the conditional 'If you want to know x's bank balance, you should hack into her computer.' As I said earlier, this assessment appears to be purely factual. As the authors put it, following Wayne Wu, you specify some level of non-fortuitousness, and figure out a path through "behavior space" (30) to get you there. This is not the same as granting normative force to the hacking actions.

Coming now to knowledge, the authors say that the form of agency required for knowledge consists in selecting external objects for cognition and action, and that this is attention. We select an object for investigation; attention "anchors" our focus on this object; we methodically complete the epistemic task in a process that demands continued attention. They seem to model this process on sequential attentive search. Where are my keys? To find them, I attend to one specific region after another with the aim of determining whether they are there (31). Similarly, I might search through my memories of a colleague to figure out how he will behave in a given situation (32). According to the authors, reasoning proceeds analogously: it requires selective and sequential attention to content. How do I come to know that there is no largest prime number? I go through the proof, sequentially attending to the content of each step.

There is a challenge to this approach that the authors parry in a somewhat controversial manner. Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky have notoriously argued that the methods most humans use are in fact irrational -- they found that given elementary everyday problems, most human beings proceed in an irrational way. The authors respond (39-44) that these methods are not irrational, but rather that they display "bounded rationality" (as Gerd Gigerenzer has eloquently argued for many decades) -- that is, they are effective in the situations that we humans find ourselves in, even if not reliable in the abstract. Of course, an epistemology that relies on bounded rationality is externalist, since the premise is that human reasoning is guided by certain contingencies, though we are not aware of these.

More seriously, perhaps, the attentional approach makes reasoning explicit in a manner made disreputable by the failure of Good Old Fashioned Artificial Intelligence. GOFAI notoriously ran into the so-called "Frame Problem:" even simple human problems demand more assumptions than can explicitly be stated. Shanahan (2016) illustrates the problem by reference to an expert system that is told (1) that painting an object changes its colour, and (2) that moving it changes its position. The system is asked: What colour is a white cup after it is moved to the garden? The system cannot answer the question because it is not told that moving something doesn't change its colour -- which is not universally true anyway; consider what happens when you move it into a tank of paint -- and it might have no information about moving cups to the garden. So, this expert system might get stuck vainly looking in its data-banks for information that might help. Humans, however, answer this kind of question rather easily.

The authors take note of the Frame Problem and propose that it is to be solved by selective inattention (or "virtuous insensitivity," 67). In this particular case, this seems to amount to the following rule: if you are not told that moving something changes its colour, then ignore the effect of moving things. It's hard to reconcile this kind of inattention with knowledge claims; it's not virtuous. The authors do not consider connectionist approaches here, which is a pity, since these approaches reconfigure the role of attention in learning in ways that potentially transform the book's problematic. Notoriously, connectionist processes are hidden from the subject's view, and cannot either be attended to as they proceed or evaluated step-by-step. They are "automatic" in ways that are impervious to agent-control, even in the more relaxed notion of control that the authors posit in Chapter 4 (104-109) -- by which automatic processes are counted as under the control of the subject if they are responsive to the aims of the subject. They are opaque in the way that Carrie's power to read character is opaque. Connectionist processes can often yield post facto rationalizations, but these may or may not be related to how they arrived at a conclusion. These kinds of process deserve at least a brief consideration by all epistemologists, but they are particularly challenging for the virtue-epistemologist's posit of rational powers.

One more problem regarding explicit reasoning. The authors are epistemic consequentialists; that is, they understand rationality as what is likely to lead to success in achieving the goal of getting at the truth. They consider an objection from deontology, namely that they would then condone "bad" actions if they lead to "good" consequences. Is it all right to disregard the truth if your action leads to more truth? Selim Berker imagines an atheistic scientist who can get money to advance her research if she forms a genuine belief in God's existence. The authors respond (48-51; see references to Berker there) that while this would be indeed be an epistemically bad thing to do, it is not a counterexample to their kind of virtue epistemology, since such beliefs violate virtuous knowledge-dispositions, regardless of their consequences. This seems right, but I would argue, contrary to their inclination, that consequentialists can in fact show a legitimate disregard for truth. Consider a quantum computer engineer who adopts an instrumentalist attitude toward the details of quantum mechanics. She says, in essence, "I don't care whether QM is literally true; all I care about is its application to my task." It is a strength of consequentialism that it permits this kind of instrumental rationality in inquiry. The intermediate steps in any process of reasoning can be "bracketed," even though they are provisionally asserted. But I am not entirely sure that the authors agree.

This is an excellent book. It is extremely methodical in its exposition; for instance, each section begins with a paragraph of the following form: "This section examines problem P. Relevant work by X and Y is discussed. We argue that p." This is admirable and very helpful. The coverage of the philosophical literature is exemplary. The reader gets a balanced, critical account of how virtue epistemology stands today. The argumentation is judicious and insightful. I learned a great deal from it, and so, I think, will anybody who reads it.


I'd like to thank my colleague, David Barnett, for helpful discussion.


Cohen, Stewart (2016). Theorizing About the Epistemic. Inquiry 59 (7-8): 839-857.

Kauppinen, Antti (forthcoming). Epistemic Norms and Epistemic Accountability. Philosophers' Imprint.

Kolodny, Niko and Brunero, John (2016). Instrumental RationalityThe Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Shanahan, Murray (2016). The Frame ProblemThe Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2016 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Wallace, R. J. (2001). Normativity, commitment, and instrumental reason. Philosophers' Imprint 1 (3): 1-26.

Williamson, Timothy (2000). Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford University Press.