Knowledge, Reason, and Taste: Kant's Response to Hume

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Paul Guyer, Knowledge, Reason, and Taste: Kant's Response to Hume, Princeton University Press, 2008, 267pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 8780691134390.

Reviewed by Richard N. Manning, University of South Florida


Paul Guyer's stated aims in this collection of previously published essays are to show that "the philosophical approach Kant developed for showing that our concept of and beliefs about causation have a foundation that Hume denied they have also provides Kant with an approach for addressing the concerns Hume raised about external objects and the self", and that, beyond the domain of metaphysics proper, "important elements of Kant's moral philosophy, his aesthetics, and his teleology can be fruitfully read as responses to Hume" (p. 7). These are fairly bland claims, but in the course of establishing them, Guyer presents in short compass his own systematic and comprehensive interpretations of these two thinkers in the areas in which their themes overlap. Here I summarize the basic positions Guyer stakes out for himself in the book's five chapters, and express a few worries along the way.

Chapter One distinguishes three varieties of skepticism -- Pyrrhonian skepticism arising from dialectical puzzles, Humean skepticism about first principles, and Cartesian skepticism about the external world -- and argues that the first two, though not the third, are central targets of refutation in Kant's theoretical and practical philosophy. In the theoretical domain, Kant argues against Humean skepticism by treating the principles he attacks as synthetic a priori rather than a posteriori, and then arguing for the possibility of such judgments by means, in part, of the transcendental idealist claim that our knowledge does not extend to things in themselves. This in turn helps Kant avoid Pyrrhonian skepticism, for the dialectical illusions that generate it arise from the failure to keep in mind the limitations on our understanding imposed by transcendental idealism. The unified basis of this strategy against the two kinds of skepticism is significant, on Guyer's reading, because if, as Guyer argues elsewhere (see his Kant and the Claims of Reason, Part V), the "Analytic's deductions need not imply transcendental idealism", then a successful Kantian refutation of Humean skepticism leaves Pyrrhonian skepticism untouched.

In the practical domain, Kant holds that our morals are prone to corruption by a natural dialectic that leads us to be skeptical of the idea of strict laws of duty and to try to make duty better conform to our inclinations. There are two dialectics in play here. The first is the dialectic between freedom and determinism, famously resolved by Kant's appeal to the possibility of a faculty of pure reason that is outside nature but efficacious on it. Guyer spends little time on this, focusing instead on the second dialectic that leads to moral skepticism, namely, that between virtue and happiness. Guyer's complex interpretation of how Kant overcomes this dialectic involves (among other things) an invocation of the solution to the dialectic of freedom and determinism, the distinction between a motive for an action and its object, and the claim that an action whose object is happiness may nonetheless be moral, so long as that object is the collective happiness of mankind.

Chapter Two discusses Kant's direct and indirect engagement with Hume on causation. Guyer isolates several distinct but related issues about causation that arise out of Hume's discussions in the Treatise and Enquiry. These include the source of the idea of causal connection, the justification of particular causal inferences, the basis for the general principle that every event has a cause, and the epistemological status of the principle of induction. Guyer notes that, unlike the Treatise, the Enquiry never mentions -- and hence never raises skeptical doubts about -- the general principle that all events have causes. Despite his unfamiliarity with the Treatise, Kant nonetheless took Hume to have called this principle into doubt. In the second "Analogy of Experience", he argues that the principle is required to ground the possibility of an objective time series of appearances -- something Hume takes for granted. According to Guyer, Kant claims that our knowledge of such objective temporal series depends upon our knowledge that they are determined by particular causal laws. Yet, Guyer claims, Kant never explains how such knowledge is possible. Thus the solution to the problem of the general principle depends upon a solution to a Humean problem that Kant himself never directly solves. Hume held that the custom or habit that induces us to infer the future from the past is what grounds (without justifying) particular causal judgments. Kant of course has no sympathy with this approach. But on Guyer's view, the attempt he made in the third Critique to ground the idea that nature is uniform solves neither Hume's problem of induction nor the problem of the justification of particular causal inferences. The need to treat nature as a system of laws is merely regulative, rather than constitutive; the application of this regulative principle is underdetermined; and we have no assurance that any such system itself must project into the future.

Guyer interprets the second "Analogy" as claiming that our representations of change (hence of time series) depend upon the knowledge, of some particular causal law, that it determines the precedent event to bring about the consequent. However, perhaps all Kant insists is that we presuppose that there exists some particular law that determines the sequence. If the latter is the case, Kant's solution to the problem of the general principle would not depend on a solution to the question of how we know particular causal laws. It may be that Kant has no solution to this latter problem, but then, he might not suppose such a solution is required, given that we know that such laws must exist (since we perceive change, as Hume accepted). Perhaps all Kant wants to do is to underwrite a principle of sufficient reason that shows how objective experience and therefore science are possible, since nature must be causally ordered. If we can secure this without an account of how we can know particular causal laws, why not rest content with good old empirical hypothesis and testing? If like Hume, however, one lacks a priori resources to show that nature is ordered causally, then one might attempt to show this by citing our knowledge of particular causal laws, in which case one would need an account of how such knowledge is acquired. This is of course sketchy on my part, but it does illustrate a general concern I have that Guyer's discussion in this chapter pays inadequate attention to the way that the transcendental character of Kant's arguments changes the dialectical significance, at least in Kant's eyes, of the problems Hume identified.

Chapter Three's main aim is to show how Kant pursued a unified strategy in treating the ideas of causation (already discussed extensively in Chapter Two), of external objects, and of the self. Kant was unaware of the skeptical treatment Hume gave the latter two in the Treatise, but realized that the Enquiry's grounds for raising doubts about the idea of necessary causal connection -- the lack of any impression from which the idea could be derived -- applied with equal force to these others. Kant's well-known strategy here is to avail himself of the resources of logic and pure intuition as sources of these ideas, and then to show that the very possibility of the knowledge of the sequence of our representations (from which Hume would insist we draw the ideas in question) in fact presupposes our commitment to those ideas. Some of the thorny issues Guyer touches on in this context are whether and how the use of the table of logical forms of judgments as a model for the table of categories undermines Kant's deductions, the adequacy of the deduction of the category of substance and its relation to the refutation of idealism, and the character of the self made evident through transcendental apperception.

"Reason is, and ought to be only the slave of the passions," proclaimed Hume. "The ground of obligation must be sought not in the nature of the human being or in the circumstances in which he is placed, but a priori simply in concepts of pure reason," subsequently wrote Kant. Conceding the stark opposition this pair of quotations makes plain, Chapter Four focuses on the deep affinities Guyer nonetheless finds between Hume's and Kant's moral theories. The main putative points of agreement are: (1) an internalism according to which a genuine moral principle must be a motive for action; (2) the assumption that we can and should modify our natural desires that might lead to unwelcome actions; and (3) the view that the proper goal of human life is mastery of our inclinations. Since many moral philosophers have held each of these theses in some form or another, this may seem like meager convergence. But again the interest is in the details. Guyer argues, for example, that Kant did not rest content with the view that respect for duty is a sufficient direct motive for moral action, but instead held that it creates a moral feeling that gives it motivating force. This marks more than a trivial convergence with Humean sentimentalism. Guyer further points out that Kant's pre-Critical strategy for explaining why morality has motivating force was to appeal to a natural, empirical love of freedom, and, citing some of Kant's fragmentary notes and reflections, argues that freedom serves as an underived end even in the mature philosophy, with reason in some way in its service.

Given the commonplace character of each of the points of agreement Guyer mentions, it is no surprise that both thinkers at least pay them some lip service. But I wish Guyer had more directly broached the question whether either is actually entitled to do so, in light of their deeper philosophical commitments. Shouldn't Hume, to be consistent, have held that the goal of a human's life is set entirely by her impulses whatever they may be, rather than, as Guyer argues, having privileged a love of tranquility? Shouldn't Kant, in fealty to his basic insights, have resolutely stayed the course of having reason dictate the content of morality without contribution from any human inclination towards freedom, and without eliciting motivational aid from feeling? Maybe Hume and Kant do agree in the way Guyer claims, but maybe they shouldn't have. And maybe there would be more intellectual payoff in emphasizing that you really can't have your cake and eat it too, than in affecting a dishonest rapprochement that obscures the real costs of adopting extreme fundamental principles, as both Hume and Kant surely did.

Chapter Five offers a reading of the Critique of the Power of Judgment as a protracted response to Hume on natural necessity, taste, and teleology. With respect to each concept, Guyer argues that Kant embraces and develops a characteristically Humean claim. In each case Kant exploits the new idea of reflecting judgment, which seeks to find universals suitable for given particulars (unlike the determining judgment, which subsumes particulars under given universals).

Kant accepts with Hume that there is no source in experience for the claim that particular laws of nature are necessarily true, but holds that it is a transcendental principle of the reflecting judgment that particular laws must be considered in terms of the sort of unity they would have if they had been created precisely so as to be tractable to our faculty of cognition. Roughly, this strategy turns the "pre-established harmony between the course of nature and the succession of our ideas" of which Hume speaks in the Enquiry into a transcendental condition on the possibility of empirical knowledge. While Guyer doubts that Kant does enough to show that this principle furnishes grounds for thinking that laws of nature are objectively necessary, he argues that Kant at least shows better than Hume why we cannot doubt the necessity of particular causal laws without calling into question the entire edifice of causal beliefs.

Kant also accepts Hume's views that, despite the fact that people argue over judgments of beauty as if they were objective, such judgments are based on subjective feeling, and there can be no objective principle that would allow us to infer the beauty of an object from a specification of its properties. But whereas Hume resolved the tension between these views by claiming that de facto agreement in judgment among the (somehow) best-qualified critics provides a kind of standard of taste that involves no criterion, Kant held that judgments of taste claim universal validity regardless of any empirical standard. In defense of this claim, Kant offers a deduction of judgments of taste according to which the subjective feeling that underlies such judgments results from a harmony between the form of the object judged and certain subjective conditions of our cognitive faculties that must be the same in all persons. Again Guyer doubts the adequacy of Kant's argument, but claims that Kant's position is nonetheless an improvement on Hume's, since it "provides some guidance for aesthetic discourse" (p. 240). This basis for a preference seems pretty weak; unless Kant does a better job than Guyer supposes of showing that the cognitive faculties implicated in judgments of taste must be common to all judges, the guidance is only apparent.

In the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion Hume's apparent spokesperson Philo gleefully heaps scorn on the argument from design as a rational basis for theology, but in the end admits both that we cannot help but think of various natural objects in terms of design, and that so doing is a valuable and ineliminable aid to natural science. Guyer points out the kinship between Hume's position and Kant's view that the design hypothesis is a merely regulative principle for the reflecting judgment, rather than a constitutive principle yielding objective knowledge. But, as he shows, Kant goes much farther than Hume. For one thing, Kant identifies just why the design hypothesis is so irresistible -- our inability to explain organisms mechanically. Most importantly, Kant argues that the inevitable appeal to design applies to our thinking of nature as a whole and not just its organic parts, and that Nature's end must be a supersensible good: freedom as the activity of the morally good will. Guyer claims, however, that Kant's attempt to link morality with natural teleology is fatally undermined by the advent of molecular genetics, which provides just the sort of mechanical explanation for organic processes the unavailability of which accounts, in Kant, for the inevitability of our teleological thinking.

Each of the main topics of these chapters -- Hume and Kant on skepticism, causation, external objects, the self, reason, desire, action, natural necessity, aesthetics, teleology -- is easily worth book-length treatment; most have received this, many of them by Guyer himself. But here, Guyer tackles them all. In a way, the achievement is breathtaking. But the scope of the issues addressed is the book's major vice. Remarks such as, "What I say here will only be a sketch of arguments that must be worked out much more fully" (p. 190, concerning the role in Kant of the love of freedom), and "we must now take stock of Kant's teleology as briefly as we have expounded it" (p. 250), are sprinkled throughout. Discussion of the vast and often contrary secondary literature is largely relegated to terse footnotes, many of which refer the reader to Guyer's own book-length studies of the issues in question. Scholars of Hume and Kant already know the basics, and where matters are not so basic, they will want more detail than is available here. Novices will get a fine introduction to Hume and Kant, and they will get a fine introduction to Guyer's interpretive views as well. But they will not be in a position to say whether these views are sound, and may not even realize just how contested they are.[1]

[1] Thanks to Rebecca Kukla for helpful editorial comments on a previous draft of this review.