Korrespondenzausgbe, volume 2: Korrespondenz 1788-1790, AND Korrespondenzausgbe, volume 3: Korrespondenz 1791

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Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Korrespondenzausgbe, volume 2: Korrespondenz 1788-1790, Faustino Fabbianelli, Eberhard Heller, Kurt Hiller, Reinhard Lauth†, Ives Radrizzani, Wolfang H. Schrader† (eds.), Fromannn-Holzboog, 2007, 372pp., € 295.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783772808289.

Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Korrespondenzausgbe, volume 3: Korrespondenz 1791, Faustino Fabbianelli, Eberhard Heller, Kurt Hiller, Reinhard Lauth†, Ives Radrizzani, Wolfang H. Schrader† (eds.), Fromannn-Holzboog, 2011, 406pp., € 328.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783772808296.

Reviewed by George di Giovanni, McGill University


These two volumes mark the resumption of the long interrupted edition of Reinhold's correspondence, the first volume of which was published in 1982. That volume covered the years from 1773 to 1788, a period which saw, of all the spiritual turns that Reinhold underwent in the years to come, certainly the most decisive one. That is the Reinhold who, as a pious young man who had recently been admitted to the Jesuit novitiate, fretted in a letter to his father about his impending return home because of the recent dissolution by the Pope of the Jesuit order and the spiritual dangers that the return might involve. The same young man was eventually ordained priest and tended for some years to the spiritual needs of a parish in Vienna while at the same time leading what must have been a very active social life: a Barnabite monk and at the same time a member of the Masonic order (an Illuminatus to boot!) busy writing anonymous pamphlets that criticized the Church and promoted typical Enlightenment social and intellectual values. This double life could not last. Reinhold eventually fled to Leipzig and converted to Protestantism. He then moved to Weimar where he collaborated with Wieland in the production of Der Teutscher Merkur, eventually marrying Wieland's daughter Sophie. It was at this time that Reinhold, who had at first ridiculed the Critique of Pure Reason for its old-fashioned scholasticism, began to look at it more seriously and published in Wieland's Merkur the first set of the so-called Kantian Letters. These helped to popularize Kant's critical work and also won for Reinhold the first appointment to the newly created Chair of Kantian Studies at the University of Jena.

The present two volumes reflect Reinhold's life in this city. It is unfortunate that, as the editors recognize, the surviving letters represent only a fragment of what must have been an extensive epistolary exchange with all the leading figures of the day and so do not convey as lively a picture of Reinhold's world as one might wish. Nonetheless, enough transpires from the letters we have to gain at least glimpses of the intimacy of Reinhold's family life and the turbulence of his professional activity. In Volume Two, by far the most letters are between Wieland and Reinhold. They detail the day-to-day vicissitudes of their two families, the births and the sicknesses, the travels, the joys and disappointments, and reveal perhaps unexpected sides of Wieland's personality, as when he reminds his son-in-law that "family good fortune is the one true good fortune on earth" (II.20) or reproves his elder daughter (Reinhold's wife) for her bad orthography, only worthy of a Friedrich II who wrote his mother-tongue as well as French "wie ein Musketier oder Schuhknecht". (II.55) Many letters are simply an account of financial remunerations due to Reinhold for his contributions to the Merkur.

Wieland himself had no doubt that Reinhold would quickly win the respect of all the literary world and have his name associated with that of Kant (III.66). In fact, however, the desired reputation proved elusive. Kant was apparently more concerned with Eberhard's attack on his critical philosophy than with anything Reinhold was doing to propagate it (cf. Letters 157 and 160). When, after a long silence in the face of Reinhold's repeated requests for some form of endorsement on his part, Kant finally sent him a note (and even that only at the instigation of Dr. Erhard who was at that time visiting him in Königsberg, III.252-53). The note politely complained that Reinhold's many abstract disquisitions were likely to scare away the friends of the Critique (III.271). Erhard also reported that Kant knew next to nothing of Reinhold's theory of representation, and had found the second part of his Fundament totally unintelligible (III.323-24). As for Jacobi, whose religiosity the Kantian Letters were especially intended to satisfy, his reaction to Reinhold was to cite for his benefit from a French journal to the effect that disputation is best applauded with silence, so that its errors have a chance to fall unnoticed (II.184). This was a veiled yet obvious reference to Reinhold's grandiloquence. Jacobi simply went on restating his position that philosophy is only learned ignorance, and that Kant, far from having revolutionized past metaphysics as Reinhold claimed, had only brought it to conclusion (II.235).

Also of interest are the reactions of the Popular Philosophers who had been Reinhold's natural intellectual associates before his Kantian conversion. Garve did not understand how such a sharp-minded thinker as Reinhold could have bought into the Critique of Reason wholesale, as if there were no serious problems affecting it (II.159). Heydenreich admitted to not being able to follow Reinhold, and only wished that his writing were more accessible to the general reader. He reported that Platner was confident that Reinhold would soon publish a piece in which he made clear that, far from being a Kantian, he still adhered to the noble philosophy Platner had had the honour of teaching him [in Leipzig] (II.153). Nicolai, writing in fluent Enlightenment prose that was worlds removed from Reinhold's convoluted style, declared himself to be still a Wolffian and, in opposition to Reinhold's progressive view of the history of philosophy, repeated his Enlightenment creed that all systems are just as equally true in some respects as equally false in others; that misunderstandings are unavoidable because of the poverty of our nature and the one-sidedness of individual languages; but that conflict is ultimately a good thing, just as necessary as opposition is to the English parliamentary government.

As for Reinhold, he saw himself attacked by both professed Kantians and anti-Kantians, and misunderstood by both. He complained about the unfair reviews he received in the Allgemeine Literatur-Zeitung, harbouring special resentment for Rehberg's contributions which, as he believed, betrayed a half-baked understanding of the Critique (II.123-24; cf. 133). But the person he seemed to mistrust the most (at least from what transpires in the letters we have) was his former teacher Platner. He blamed him for having poisoned the waters with Prince Friedrich Christian von Augustenburg, on whom he had pinned his hopes for an appointment in Copenhagen, (III.125) and with Kant as well, whom Platner planned to visit in Königsberg in order to convince him that the principal ideas of the Critique were already contained in his (Platner's) Aphorismen (III.270).

Volume Three includes the well known correspondence that Maimon initiated with Reinhold and eventually published without the latter's permission. One could blame Maimon for taking too narrow a view of Kant's critical project. Nonetheless, he clearly exposed its vulnerability to sceptical attack (cf. Letter 285, 291), and this is something that Reinhold never understood. Nor is it clear that he ever understood the strength of Forberg's objections to the Critique of Judgement (Letter 275). Volume Three also includes reports of such events as the commotion caused by the false news that Schiller -- recently settled in Jena -- had died (Letter 272; cf. Letter 279, 169-70). So far as epistolary quantity goes, however, by far the largest number of letters in this volume are between Reinhold and his Danish disciple -- poet and literary man at large -- Jens Immanuel Baggesen. Reinhold was not happy at Jena. He felt himself surrounded by pedantry (III.325) (though there is no mention in the extant letters of his controversy with C. C. E. Schmid), and was irritated, moreover, by the University's slack administration, which allowed a good portion of his students to skip town without paying the fees owed to him (Letter 273). In Baggesen, who apparently was a close associate of the Prince von Augustenburg, Reinhold saw an influential intermediary for obtaining a position in Denmark. The correspondence is a record of the negotiations in this regard -- of the financial considerations, the hopes, the delays, the misunderstandings, that they elicited. At one point the Prince came incognito to visit Reinhold at Jena, revealing his true personality only at the end of the visit (Letter 287). Wieland did not approve of the planned move, on both financial and political grounds (Letter 254), and in fact it came to naught.

But the Reinhold-Baggesen correspondence is of historical interest for another reason as well. Reinhold himself had occasion to comment on the peculiar character of Baggesen's communication. As he said to Baggesen, he had received a steady stream of letters from him, each a delight for him to savour, yet no reply to his own letters for over half a year (III.262). Indeed, Baggesen's long missives bore as a rule no connection to Reinhold's letters or, for that matter, to each other. Each was a self-contained vignette of the author's sentimental state of mind at the moment of writing, its style very much reminiscent of Lawrence Sterne, to whose Tristram Shandy Baggesen explicitly refers (III.183). Baggesen clearly belonged to the late Enlightenment culture of sentiment of which Reinhold was also a product.

Then we run across a letter to Reinhold by a certain Georg Friedrich Philip von Hardenberg, the future Novalis (Letter 304), which is just as effusive as Baggesen's letters and is apparently even inspired by Baggesen (III.290), yet reveals on closer reading a completely different spiritual universe. The letter opens without preamble with a two page account of a turbulent mind in the grip of fantastic visions, eventually to announce -- as if the need for an object had suddenly been felt -- that Schiller was the subject of the letter. More pages follow extolling with equal enthusiasm the poetic genius of this man, and also divagating on such subjects as poetry and science, finally to come to rest ("conclude" would not be the right word) with the announcement that he (that is, Hardenberg) intends to come to Leipzig to pursue studies in Jurisprudence, Mathematics, and Philosophy. In the contrast between Baggesen and Hardenberg we are witnessing the shift from the culture of the bel esprit of the Late Enlightenment to that of the "genius" of the then incipient Romanticism. Reinhold himself was caught in this transition. Whether he ever fully understood its nature and significance is indeed a good question.

We should expect the next volume to document Reinhold's move to Kiel and hopefully also to throw light on the circumstances of the move. Also to be hoped is that relevant and sufficient correspondence is extant to document Reinhold's Masonic activities, an important dimension of his life which in the present two volumes -- except for two brief and uninformative letters of Ignaz von Born (Letter 155,185) -- remains totally unreported.