Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions Revisited

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Vasso Kindi and Theodore Arabatzis (eds.), Kuhn's The Structure of Scientific Revolutions Revisited, Routledge, 2012, 259pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415808552.

Reviewed by K. Brad Wray, State University of New York, Oswego


This book is an edited collection of papers, most of which were initially presented at a conference in Athens, Greece in 2008. The conference aimed to reevaluate Structure, as the fiftieth anniversary of Kuhn's remarkable book approached. There is an introduction by the editors and ten papers, grouped thematically in three parts under the following headings: "Origins and Early Reception", "Key Concepts", and "Implications." Despite the fact that Structure influenced scholars in many disciplines, the papers in the collection are all philosophical studies. The only author who is not a philosopher is Wes Sharrock, a sociologist, who coauthored a piece with Rupert Read, and previously coauthored a book on Kuhn with Read.

The collection's publication is timely, part of a great wave of conferences, books and special issues of journals dedicated to celebrating the fiftieth anniversary of Kuhn's book. The level of scholarship in recent publications about Kuhn is quite sophisticated. Philosophers are no longer preoccupied with criticizing a facile and implausible Kuhn, a defender of irrationalism and relativism. Instead, contemporary philosophers are concerned with unearthing the sources that influenced Kuhn, tracing the evolution or development of his views, drawing out the implications of and applying his general framework.

Before I summarize some of the key insights of the papers, I want to make three general remarks. First, it was wise to focus narrowly on philosophical studies. As it is, the collection is wide ranging. To include papers from scholars from other disciplines would dilute the unity of the collection even further. Second, it seems that the grouping of the papers into the three parts is arbitrary. The papers included in any one part are no more unified with each other than they are with other papers in the volume. Consequently, it seems the various papers could have been grouped in a number of different ways. Third, as an indication of the general quality of the papers, I note that I wish I had attended the conference in 2008. The results of the gathering are generally quite thoughtful.

I will now outline some of the key findings.

Gürol Irzik examines the relationship between Structure and the logical positivists. This is Irzik's latest installment in an ongoing debate about whether Kuhn killed positivism. Irzik is especially interested in examining the sources that Kuhn neglects to mention, most importantly Carnap's and Hempel's work. A theme that Irzik fails to examine in much detail is the influence of Quine on Kuhn's reading of logical positivism. Quine was a senior fellow in the Harvard Society of Fellows when Kuhn was retraining as a historian of science in the Society, Kuhn thanks Quine in Structure, and Quine thanks Kuhn in Word and Object. Given Quine's reading of Carnap, it is no surprise that Kuhn did not think he had to attend to the latest developments of positivism.

James Marcus traces the development of the paradigm concept by examining a series of papers Kuhn wrote and published in the 1960s and early 1970s. He draws on the Kuhn archives at MIT, an interesting and important development in Kuhn scholarship. This paper, though, is the weakest in the collection. The author's accounts of the contents of the various papers examined are merely descriptive, lacking either analysis or synthesis. The paper adds no insight into the development of the paradigm concept, or its relation to the concepts "disciplinary matrix" and "exemplar." Further, Marcus is careless in the way he employs Kuhn's terms of analysis. For example, he claims that Kuhn believed that "scientific progress -- in contrast to normal science -- is incommensurable" (41). Progress and normal science are not appropriate categories to contrast. Rather, the appropriate contrast class for normal science is revolutionary science. Further, Kuhn did not regard progress as incommensurable. Rather, competing theories are incommensurable.

Read and Sharrock aim to show that Kuhn's approach to studying science is far more radical than most philosophers realize. Their paper is one of the most insightful and interesting in the collection. They compare Kuhn's project in Structure to Peter Winch's study of the social sciences, The Idea of a Social Science. Both Kuhn and Winch were influenced by Wittgenstein. Importantly, Kuhn wants us to see that studying scientists and scientific theories of the past is like entering a radically different culture. Things that at first sight look familiar are in fact not so familiar. And philosophers and historians of science would benefit from recognizing this. Indeed, Read and Sharrock want us to see that many of Kuhn's critics are stuck in the traditional framework, and fail to see how radical Kuhn's proposal is. Adopting Kuhn's perspective on science, though, dissolves many of the traditional questions that preoccupied philosophers. For example, Read and Sharrock want us to see the futility of the following question: "Given what we now understand, was the change of loyalties [from one theory to another] an unequivocally rational move?" (76). Answers to this question would offer little insight into the nature of science or scientific rationality.

Vasso Kindi also examines the concept of a paradigm. Kindi's concern is to compare Kuhn's view with Wittgenstein's and to correct some misunderstandings on Kuhn's part. Most significantly, Kindi insists that Kuhn was mistaken to contrast paradigms with rules. I think Kindi's criticism is, unfortunately, based on a misreading of Kuhn. By "rule" Kuhn had in mind an algorithm, something we could program a machine to execute. Indeed, this is what he took the positivists to be aiming for. But Kuhn did not think the success of science was due to scientists following methodological recipes mechanically. Kuhn's appeal to paradigms was meant in part to emphasize the creativity and learned judgment required to conduct scientific research.

Thomas Nickles also raises concerns about the paradigm concept. Nickles is concerned that by insisting on the inflexibility of paradigms, Kuhn makes paradigm change impossible, and exaggerates the magnitude of changes of theory. Nickles believes Kuhn's view leads to a puzzle: either (i) paradigms are inflexible, but then scientific change seems impossible; or (ii) paradigms are quite flexible, but then revolutionary changes of theory are not so different from normal scientific discoveries. I believe that his criticism is also based on an uncharitable reading of Kuhn. In the background of Nickles' critical analysis is his own earlier work on the multi-pass conception of scientific inquiry. According to Nickles, developing scientific concepts and theories is a long drawn out process. And the full implications of a theory are only discovered as scientists apply the theory. I have always thought of Nickles' multi-pass conception as developing and extending Kuhn's work on scientific discovery. Consequently, I think Kuhn would have been open to recognizing the complexity of the development and application of paradigms over time. So part of the problem that Nickles attempts to saddle Kuhn with is not a problem for Kuhn at all. Nonetheless, Kuhn would not be prepared to give up on the fundamental distinction between normal science and revolutionary change, a distinction that Nickles seems to try to erode.

Jouni-Matti Kuukkanen examines the evolutionary dimensions of Kuhn's philosophy of science. In Structure Kuhn argued that we should stop seeing science as moving toward some fixed goal set by nature in advance. In this respect, scientific change is like biological evolution. This insight is similar to the change in perspective urged by Read and Sharrock. Kuukkanen also examines additional similarities between evolution and scientific change that Kuhn drew attention to in his later work. Scientific fields are subject to increasing specialization, just as biological species are prone to speciation. And Kuhn suggests that in this context, incommensurable theoretical frameworks serve to isolate neighboring specialties from each other, thus encouraging and aiding their development along independent lines.

Hasok Chang re-examines the chemical revolution, a key episode in the history of science and in Kuhn's thinking about scientific change when he was writing Structure. Chang is principally concerned to determine whether the competing theories, the phlogiston theory and the oxygen theory, were incommensurable. Chang draws the important and widely accepted distinction between semantic incommensurability and methodological incommensurability. Chang argues persuasively that the importance of semantic incommensurability has been greatly exaggerated. Key theoretical terms often do not retain the same meaning in successive theories in a field. Ptolemy's planets are not Copernicus', and Newton's mass is not Einstein's. But this is not a major impediment to theory change and theory evaluation. The real problems arise because of methodological incommensurability. Different theories address different problems, and consequently advocates of competing theories often do not agree about the epistemic merits of the competing theories. Rightly, Chang notices that Kuhn's attention turned more and more to semantic incommensurability, and this was a mistake. Chang ends his paper urging us to return to Structure; specifically, we should focus our attention on methodological incommensurability. Clearly, this is one of the most important aspects of Structure that continues to deserve our attention.

Hanne Andersen's paper is one of the more thoughtful in the volume. Her paper also draws on material from the Kuhn archives, in this case, diagrams made by Kuhn illustrating his views on lexicons and lifelines, concepts that figure importantly in his developing view. Andersen is concerned with extending and applying a Kuhnian framework, addressing issues and concerns that Kuhn did not address. Most importantly, Andersen is doing pioneering work on interdisciplinary scientific research. Further, Andersen rightly notes that many productive researchers do not work in just one scientific specialty. Their position in two fields is likely an important source of novel ideas. A fuller understanding of scientific change and scientific discovery will require us to look more carefully at these features of scientific inquiry. Indeed, this is one of the most promising areas for future research that builds on Kuhn's general framework.

Alexander Bird examines Kuhn's approach to naturalizing the epistemology of science and its impact on the sociology of science. Bird argues that though the proponents of the Strong Programme in the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge purport to be studying science scientifically, their approach is deeply at odds with Kuhn's conception of naturalized epistemology. Most importantly, Kuhn was interested in internalist studies of science, which ask how epistemic factors influence the outcome of scientific disputes. Like the proponents of the Strong Programme, Kuhn believed it was important to examine how the social structure of scientific institutions and practices influences scientists. But he did not believe that non-epistemic factors affected scientific change in mature fields, at least not to the extent that the proponents of the Strong Programme suggest.

Alan Richardson examines what historians of philosophy could learn from Kuhn's study of science. Richardson believes that we would have a far richer understanding of the views of earlier philosophers, even the canonical philosophers, those who we assume are so familiar to us, if we paid more attention to studying the context in which they wrote. Leibniz's philosophy cannot be separated or understood separately from his science. If we studied philosophers in context, we would begin to see that their issues are not our issues, and that we distort our understanding of their views when we fail to recognize this.

As noted above, I wish I had the opportunity to attend the conference. This is an important collection of papers that are worthy contributions to our understanding of Thomas Kuhn's philosophy and of Structure in particular.