L'Action Efficace: Études sur la philosophie de l'action d'Aristote

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Carlo Natali, L'Action Efficace: Études sur la philosophie de l'action d'Aristote, Peeters, 2004, 251pp, $44.00 (pbk), ISBN 9042914319.

Reviewed by Daniel Devereux, University of Virginia


This collection of essays, written during the period 1985-2002, covers a variety of topics relating to Aristotle's discussion of human action. A good part of the book is devoted to careful analysis of texts that distinguish action from natural movements or events on the one hand, and from production on the other (chapters II, III, VI, and VII). Moving out from these central studies, Natali discusses such topics as "Human and Divine Activity" (IV), "Action and Pleasure" (V), and "Human Action, Determinism, and Moral Responsibility" (IX and X). The central studies include some discussion of contemporary action theory, both analytic and Continental, and its relationship to Aristotle's views. Natali suggests, for instance, that there are important differences between Aristotle's questions and ours in this area, and that failure to appreciate this fact has led to problems in interpreting Aristotle's views and sometimes to unfair criticism of those views. In attempting to understand human action and how it differs from natural movements or events, Natali claims that Aristotle's typical approach is to consider fairly complex examples rather than simple actions such as raising one's arm. He is not interested in drawing a sharp boundary between actions and natural movements; rather he considers paradigm cases of each in order to capture their nature in its full complexity. A consequence of this method is that there will be many cases where it is unclear whether or not something qualifies as an action. In contrast with the Aristotelian procedure, Natali argues that the tendency in recent philosophy of action, especially in the analytic tradition, is to focus on simple examples and to attempt to determine necessary and sufficient conditions for what is to count as an action. One might quibble that Natali's account of the typical approach of recent analytic philosophers of action is perhaps oversimplified (those influenced by Wittgenstein's notion of 'family resemblance' seem to employ the paradigm case approach); but there is also room for doubt about his description of Aristotle's procedure. In several places, Aristotle claims that the behavior of children and animals does not qualify as action (praxis) in the strict sense, and the reason he gives is that they are incapable of choice (prohairesis) (see, e.g., Metaphysics VI 1, 1025b18-24, and Nicomachean Ethics [NE] VI 2, 1139a17-b5). One might infer from these and similar passages that Aristotle does mean to give a clear-cut criterion for what is to count as action; by spelling out what is involved in his concept of choice, one would have a clear understanding of what distinguishes human action from natural events and the behavior of children and animals. (We will come back to this possibility in a moment.)

Natali points out that Aristotle seems more interested in distinguishing action from production than in determining how it differs from natural movement. We would perhaps take it for granted that, e.g., building a garage counts as an action, but Aristotle considers this to be an instance of production and not an action. According to Natali, the difference has to do with how actions and productions are related to ends. The notion of an end is essential for an understanding of all three: action, production, and natural movement. Drawing from Aristotle's discussion of movement (kinesis) and activity (energeia) in Metaphysics IX 6, Natali explains that in the case of both a natural movement and a production the end is only achieved at the completion of the movement or production, whereas in the case of an action the end is present in the action from beginning to end--the action is complete at any moment of its duration. Actions belong to the class of 'activities' (energeiai) for which both 'is φing' and 'has φd' are true at any point during the activity, and this is tantamount to saying that the action has its end in itself (cf. 60-1). The movements performed in producing something are not performed for their own sake but for the sake of the result aimed at; actions, on the other hand, are performed for their own sake. However, insofar as actions involve physical movements, they are not pure activities: the movements themselves are not complete at every moment. Even human thinking or contemplating will fall short of pure activity in that their objects are complex and there is a passage from part to part. Only in the case of divine contemplation is there pure activity. Thus human action lies on a spectrum with natural movement and production at one end, and the pure activity of divine contemplation at the other; action is essentially an activity and not a movement, but it is not pure activity and it necessarily involves kinetic aspects.

There are a couple of problems with taking the passage in Metaphysics IX 6 as the key to understanding Aristotle's conception of action. According to Natali's understanding of this passage, an action (a praxis) has an end which is present in it from beginning to end: the end is not something achieved by the action in stages. However, the ethical treatises do not provide support for this view. In the NE Aristotle says that "actions are for the sake of other things" (III 3, 1112b31-33), and that only those exercises of the virtues, i.e. actions, that "reach their end are pleasant" (III 9, 1117b15-16; cf. X 7, 1177b16-18). It also seems clear that many if not most virtuous actions are more like productions than activities: the agent acts with a certain end in view, and the 'action' consists of a series of steps designed to achieve the end--e.g. the organization of a chorus as an exercise of munificence (cf. Natali, 90). Furthermore, the end for the sake of which the action is chosen may or may not be achieved. In the case of a production (a poiesis), the activities leading to the end only have value insofar as the end is achieved; but a virtuous action, as something fine and admirable, is also choiceworthy for its own sake even if it fails to achieve its end. One might argue that since (virtuous) action is choiceworthy for its own sake, it has its end present in it 'from the beginning'. However, Aristotle's explanation of virtuous action's being choiceworthy for its own sake is not that the formula 'is φing and has φd' is true of it at any point: it is rather that such action--even if it fails to achieve its goal--is noble and fine. Moreover, the distinction between activity and movement does not seem to mark off human action from animal behavior: a lion watching its prey would seem to be just as much engaged in an activity as a man thinking (Metaphysics IX 6, 1048b23-24).

Natali gives a different sort of account of what is distinctive about human action in his discussion of Aristotle's position vis-à-vis determinism. He argues that Aristotle cannot be considered a proponent of determinism for two main reasons. First, determinism, ancient and modern, sees actions as links in causal chains in which the causality is homogeneous--i.e. essentially 'efficient' causes ('causes motrices', 188). Since Aristotle's understanding of the causality of action is heterogeneous, involving efficient, formal, and final causes, his view must be different from traditional determinist views (185-91). This explanatory scheme, however, applies to animal behavior as well as human action, and Aristotle claims that human action differs from animal behavior in its causal basis: the former derives ultimately from a principle within the agent whereas the latter does not (Eudemian Ethics [EE] II 6, 1222b14-20; cf. II 8, 1224a20-30; NE III 3, 1112b31-32; III 5, 1113b17-19). This implies that the 'causal history' of an animal's movements can be ultimately traced to factors outside the animal; a human action, by contrast, has its ultimate origin in a decision or choice made by the agent (EE II 10, 1226b17-23; NE VI 2, 1139a31-b5). Thus the fact that Aristotle uses heterogeneous causes in explaining human action does not show that he is not a determinist, for he apparently regards animal behavior as causally determined by heterogeneous causes. We should therefore consider more closely, as Natali does (191-7), what is the basis of the claim that action has its origin in the agent. Aristotle classes actions among things that "may or may not come to be," and says that such things have causes or principles of the same sort; thus if a certain action is brought about by the agent's decision, that decision might or might not have been made: it was in the "agent's power to do or not to do the action" (EE II 6, 1222b41-1223a20). The power of decision or choice (prohairesis) implies the ability to reason with a view to an end, and Aristotle holds that animals (and children) lack this ability (II 10, 1226b10-29). Decision (prohairesis) also implies a selection of one option over another (NE III 2, 1112a16-17), and it was not necessary that one option be selected over another: e.g. in the case of acrasia reason directs us not to do X, but we may follow our desire to do X; since such action is voluntary, it was in our power not to do it (NE III 1, 1110a15-18). Thus it is the capacity to reason with a view to an end that explains the fact that human action is distinguished from animal behavior by having its ultimate origin in the agent.

The claim that what distinguishes human action from animal behavior (and natural movement) is its origin in choice or decision (prohairesis) is made by Aristotle in a number of passages. For instance, in NE VI 2 he says that the principle (arche) of action, i.e. that from which the movement springs, is choice (1139a31-32), and in Metaphysics VI 1 he equates 'what is done' (to prakton) with 'what is chosen' (to proaireton). It is true, as Natali points out, that Aristotle's concept of action is much more restricted than modern conceptions. The connection to choice implies that a piece of behavior only qualifies as an action if it follows from and manifests the character of the agent, for there is "no choice without a state of character" (out' aneu êthikês estin hexeôs hê proairesis: 1139a33-34; cf . 1111b4-6). Since the technical activities of the craftsman are not in themselves reflective of character, they don't count as actions. And the connection to character should remind us that, for Aristotle, morally vicious deeds also count as actions in the strict sense. Such actions, however, are not choiceworthy for themselves: the unjust merchant who cheats a customer does not perform that action for its own sake but for the sake of the money to be made. Here we see another reason for doubting that 'having its end in itself' is a necessary feature of action (or praxis) for Aristotle.

These problems notwithstanding, Natali's discussions are of great value for their careful analyses of a wide variety of texts and their engagement with current scholarly work on Aristotle's theory of action. Anyone interested in Aristotle's concept of praxis and its relationship to his ethics and physics will find these essays stimulating and rewarding.