Lacan Contra Foucault: Subjectivity, Sex, and Politics

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Nadia Bou Ali and Rohit Goel (eds.), Lacan Contra Foucault: Subjectivity, Sex, and Politics, Bloomsbury, 2019, 217pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350036888.

Reviewed by Alex J. Feldman, University of West Georgia


This book grew out of a 2015 conference at the American University of Beirut. Its six chapters are technical and require prior familiarity with both Foucault and Lacan. Most of the authors have a background in both philosophy and psychoanalysis, but other disciplines are represented as well. The influence of the Slovenian approach to Lacan is particularly pronounced: at least four of the six contributors have studied or taught at the University of Ljubljana. Despite the title, only half of the chapters bear directly on the complex relationship between Foucault and Lacan. Lacan specialists are heavily represented in this volume, but Foucault scholars are missing.

In Chapter 1, "Cutting Off the King's Head," Mladen Dolar takes up Foucault's famous line: "We need to cut off the King's head: in political theory that has still to be done." Foucault's point is that our understanding of power has not kept pace with how power actually functions today. We still tend to think of power as emanating from a central source, rather than as something built out of diffuse and mobile relations. For Dolar, the question then is whether Foucault's 1976 History of Sexuality, volume 1 (hereafter "HS") stays true to this insight. He also wants to challenge Foucault's suggestion that psychoanalysis retains a "monarchical" conception of power. He argues that Foucault caricatures psychoanalytic theory in HS and that Foucault "completely circumvents the problem of the unconscious" (45). Toward the end of his chapter, however, Dolar finds a surprisingly "analogous" set of reflections in Lacan and Foucault about political modernity. For Lacan, political modernity involves the death of the "symbolic authority" of the dead father. This death "is not just the happy spread of triumphant democracy, but rather the rise of the underside of the symbolic father, and the psychoanalytic name for it is the superego, whose rule is more intractable, or far more difficult to cope with" (49). One wishes that Dolar had pursued this possible convergence further. Is there something like the "rule of the superego" in the twin compulsions to self-surveil (Discipline and Punish) and self-confess (HS) that govern what Foucault calls the "modern soul"?

In his conclusion, Dolar reads Foucault as being committed to a strict alternative: "either the monarchy of sex-desire or the plurality of bodies and pleasures" (49). Dolar presumably has in mind the famous lines from the final part of HS: "The rallying point [le point d'appui] for the counterattack against the deployment of sexuality [le dispositif de sexualité] ought not to be sex-desire, but bodies and pleasures" (HS 157). Yet Foucault identifies three options in this passage, not two. One may submit to dispositif of sexuality (with its compulsory self-scrutiny and self-confession), one may struggle against it by insisting on the truth of one's sex and one's desire, or one may turn instead to bodies and pleasures. Choosing the latter hardly means embracing an ungrounded "fundamental ontological stance" or preference for abstract multiplicity (50). One could attempt instead to explicate what Foucault means by "bodies and pleasures" by looking at his writings on the importance of gay friendship or at the comparison in his later work of the Greek regime of aphrodisia (pleasures), the post-Augustinian regime of the flesh, and the modern regime of sexuality -- but Dolar does not do this. In short, what is missed is the profound link between the critique in HS of Freudo-Marxism's vision of sexual liberation and the subsequent positive project of a collective queer askêsis and ethos.[1]

If Dolar focuses on the question of Foucault and psychoanalysis, Lorenzo Chiesa, in Chapter 2, "Author, Subject, Structure: Lacan Contra Foucault," turns instead to the question of subjectivity. Although this chapter is wide-ranging, it is, at heart, an interpretation of Foucault's 1969 talk "What Is an Author?" Lacan attended this talk and asked a question at the end, but we have no record of a reply from Foucault; in his Seminar XVI, Lacan returns to Foucault's talk (56ff). Chiesa uses this rendez-vous manqué to develop something like a debate between Lacan and Foucault on structuralism and the subject. "In Seminar XVI," Chiesa notes, "Lacan does not comment on Foucault's considerations on the subject in the conclusion of 'What Is an Author?'" (58). Chiesa then provides something like a Lacanian reading of this conclusion. But a serious difficulty arises here. Chiesa does not mention the problem of the textual variants of "What Is an Author?" Foucault gave "What Is an Author?" a second time in 1970 at SUNY Buffalo, but the conclusion of that version contains significant changes. The editors of the French-language collection of Foucault's shorter writings, Dits et écrits, have done an admirable job of comparing the two variants in their footnotes. Chiesa, however, cites exclusively from the version of the paper found in the Essential Works collection, which misleadingly advertises itself as a translation of the original paper and which includes none of the editorial material from the Dits et écrits. Indeed, Chiesa focuses his criticism precisely on those passages that only appear in the American version, passages with which Lacan could not have been familiar.

"What Is an Author?" was composed a few years after Roland Barthes's "Death of the Author." Unlike Barthes, Foucault does not so much celebrate the death of the author in literary interpretation as seek to understand the changing discursive function of the author's proper name. At the end of his paper, however, Foucault suggests that there is a deeper philosophical significance in what he has said about the changing role of the author-function. These changes force us to rethink the "privileges of the subject." The idea of a foundational subject behind all discourse must be abandoned, but this does not mean that philosophical questions about subjectivity should be dispensed with altogether; instead, the problem is to "analyze [the subject] as a complex and variable function of discourse."[2] Chiesa, relying on a questionable interpretation of the American version of the text, then claims that Foucault "advocates" an "anonymous murmur," or the replacement of the subject with something like an undifferentiated vital force (59-60). In the original version of the paper, however, Foucault is simply speculating about how discourse would circulate in a society in which the author function has disappeared. He is engaging, in other words, in a thought-experiment, not a crypto-ontological claim.[3]

In Chapter 3, "Better Failures: Science and Psychoanalysis," Samo Tomšič steers in a different direction. He emphasizes Lacan and Foucault's shared interest in developing "a critical epistemology" that would focus primarily on error and failure rather than on truth (83). This theme provides an occasion for Tomšič to examine the respective relationships of Lacan and Foucault to the tradition of French history and philosophy of science (épistémologie historique) that runs from Cavaillès, Koyré, and Bachelard to Canguilhem and beyond. According to Tomšič, Lacan is closer to Koyré's approach, while Foucault is closer to Canguilhem's "vitalism" (94-95). This claim, however, is not sufficiently developed, and it ignores the complexity of Canguilhem's treatment of vitalism.[4] Tomšič also confuses Foucault's paraphrase of the later Canguilhem's views with Foucault's own position on the relationship between life and error.[5] Tomšič argues that there is a certain convergence between the conception of scientific reasoning one finds in French philosophy of science and the view of the human mind and the role of the unconscious in Freud and Lacan (100). It is surprising not to see Bachelard's "psychoanalysis of objective knowledge" mentioned here.[6]

After these three chapters, the second half of the book branches out broadly. Joan Copjec reads Abbas Kiarostami's film Taste of Cherry through the lens of Levinas's De l'existence à l'existent (Chapter 5, "Battle Fatigue: Kiarostami and Capitalism"). Readers interested in the relationship between psychoanalysis and phenomenology will find what Copjec has to say about fatigue (Levinas) and the wish to sleep (Freud) worthwhile, but the connection of this chapter to Lacan and Foucault is tenuous, with Foucault in particularly seeming to be tacked on as an afterthought (143). In Chapter 4, "Merely Analogical: Structuralism and the Critique of Political Economy," Anne van Leeuwen argues that Gayle Rubin's "Traffic in Women" (1975) remains indispensable for those who want to bring together the Marxist critique of political economy and feminism. Rubin draws on Lévi-Strauss's Elementary Structures of Kinship to argue for an analogy between the production of gender (through cultural rules concerning exogamy) and the production of commodities under capitalism. Van Leeuwen concludes that Rubin's argument must be radicalized. Rather than an analogy between structuralism and Marxism, there is a "real affinity" or an "isomorphism" between the value form that Marx analyzes and the "sexual non-relation" in Lévi-Strauss and Rubin (125, 130-131). This is a provocative thesis, but it would be helpful to have a better sense of what van Leeuwen means by "affinity," "homology," and "isomorphism" (surely these are not all the same?) and of what is at stake politically in insisting on a more than merely analogical resemblance between commodity fetishism and sex/gender fetishism.

The book concludes with a long chapter by Zdravko Kobe on "Foucault's Neoliberal Post-Marxism." Kobe focuses on the governmentality lecture courses from 1978-9, where Foucault discusses neoliberalism. After critical remarks about Marx in The Order of Things (1966), Foucault quickly shifted his views and engaged positively with Marx until around 1976. Kobe pursues Foucault's changing political commitments after 1968, but he neglects to mention the new light shed on Foucault's relationship to Marx by the publication of The Punitive Society lecture course. As early as 2004, Stéphane Legrand had already argued that this course ought to force a reconsideration of Foucault's debt to Marx, so it is strange to see it neglected here.[7] Although Kobe initially claims that the question of whether Foucault was a neoliberal is meaningless (179), he appears to conclude that Foucault did arrive at a neoliberal position (186). This kind of claim is probably already familiar to readers acquainted with the work of Michael Behrent and Daniel Zamora, but it is hardly the only interpretation possible. A short "Coda" is the only place where Kobe discusses Lacan and Foucault together. He argues that Foucault remained consistently hostile to psychoanalysis after HS (187-191).

The question of Lacan and Foucault is certainly worth posing again today, especially now that we are at some remove from the polemics of the 1960s and 1970s. Only three of the six chapters, however, really touch on the theme of the title, and the title itself is tendentious. It would have been helpful to consider attempts to renovate psychoanalysis through Foucault, rather than to see Foucault and psychoanalysis as strictly opposed. No mention is made in this volume, however, of the project of a Foucauldian psychoanalysis announced by Jean Allouch in 1998 and recently explored by Laurie Laufer, among others, in France.[8] Despite the editors' comments in their introduction, much of the book concerns what Foucault says about psychoanalysis in HS (with the notable exception of Chiesa). There is little engagement with the Psychiatric Power or Abnormal lecture courses, but these, along with Subjectivité et vérité, the Hermeneutics of the Subject, and, now, Les Aveux de la chair, provide a much richer sense of the arguments that Foucault announced in schematic fashion in HS.

Finally, some of the shorter writings in Dits et écrits provide a better sense of Foucault's "ambivalent" view of psychoanalysis (as Derrida once put it). In the question-and-answer period following his talk "Les mailles du pouvoir," for example, Foucault distinguishes between "Reich and the Reichians, Marcuse, and, on the other hand, the psychoanalysts who are more properly psychoanalytic, such as Melanie Klein and of course Lacan," and he names the former group as the real target of the polemic in HS. Indeed, he points out that he uses the word représsion, not refoulement, in HS; the latter, however, is the standard translation of Freud's Verdrängung in French.[9] Moreover, in a short interview after Lacan's death in 1981, Foucault pays tribute to him for trying to wrest psychoanalysis away from its normalizing and medicalizing tendencies.[10] In other words, some of Foucault's ambivalence about psychoanalysis should be seen as an awareness of internal divisions within the psychoanalytic movement. Foucault's debt to Robert Castel's critique, in Le psychanalysme (1973), of the institutionalization of psychoanalysis could also be called upon to explain some of the passages from HS cited in this volume.

On the late end of Foucault's work, it is particularly surprising that no one in this volume returns to the question of Foucault's praise for Lacan in the Hermeneutics of the Subject (1982). The late Foucault was preoccupied, as we now understand, with the question of the relationship between subjectivity and truth. Strikingly, Foucault names only two recent thinkers who have taken up this question in a way similar to his own: Heidegger and Lacan.[11] The editors acknowledge this passage (4), but the contributors do not take it up. On the early end of Foucault's work, it would be helpful to consider what Foucault's early treatment of Lacan in his Binswanger translation and other publications up through History of Madness (1961) suggest about his subsequent views. It would also be helpful to ask, as Leonard Lawlor and others have done, whether Foucault might have borrowed the term "archaeology" at least in part from psychoanalysis (recall that Ricœur places great emphasis on "the archaeology of the subject" in his book on Freud).[12]

Along similar lines, it is surprising to find no mention of Arnold Davidson's attempt to take up the Foucauldian project of an archaeology of psychoanalysis in a way that is more sympathetic to Freud. According to Kobe, "one has to choose either to accept the pertinence of Foucault's critique of psychoanalysis, including Freud and Lacan, or to reject his [archaeological] method altogether" (191). This is surely a false dilemma. Finally, more attention should be paid to way in which queer theory has engaged the question of a Foucault-Lacan mediation. Although Rubin and Butler are discussed in van Leeuwen's chapter, there is no treatment of them in other contributions; more recent work on the topic, such as Lynne Huffer's Mad for Foucault: Rethinking the Foundations of Queer Theory, does not come up either.

Although Lacan and Foucault wrote largely in independence of one another, they do share at least three sets of concerns: questions about the historical and philosophical foundations of the human sciences, questions about the relationship between psychoanalytic technique and technologies of power, and an investment in rethinking subjectivity and sex in a way that would break both with the "philosophy of the subject" and with the normalization of conduct. Much work remains to be done in each of these areas for those interested in both Foucault and psychoanalysis.

[1] See, for example, "Friendship as a Way of Life," in Essential Works of Foucault, vol. 1 (New York: New Press, 1997), 135-140.

[2] "Qu'est-ce qu'un auteur?" reprinted in Foucault, Dits et écrits, vol. 1, edited by Daniel Defert, François Ewald, and Jacques Lagrange (Paris: "Quarto" Gallimard, 2001, no. 69, 838-9). Hereafter abbreviated DE, followed by volume number, text number, and page number. The English translation (from the 1970 version) of the passages in question can be found at Foucault, Essential Works of Foucault, vol. 2 (New York: Free Press, 1998), 220-221, hereafter abbreviated as EWA.

[3] Chiesa reads Foucault as offering "the enthusiastic prefiguration of the 'anonymity of a murmur'" (59). But this is a distortion even of the American version of the text, which reads thus: "I think that, as our society changes, at the very moment when it is in the process of changing, the author function will disappear, and in such a manner that fiction and its polysemous texts will once again function according to another mode, but still with a system of constraint -- one that will no longer be the author but will have to be determined or, perhaps, experienced [expérimenter: experimented with -- AF]. All discourses, whatever their status, form, value, and whatever the treatment to which they will be subjected, would then develop in the anonymity of a murmur" (EWA 222). In place of the first sentence, the French version has something less prophetic: "On peut imaginer une culture où les discours circuleraient et seraient reçus sans que la fonction-auteur apparaisse jamais" (DE I no. 69, 839). The point is simply that a society in which appeals to the identity of the author do not play an important role in the circulation, reception, and interpretation of discourse is entirely thinkable. The circulation, reception, and interpretation of discourse in such a society would still be governed by certain constraints, of course.

[4] In attempting to restore the dignity of the vitalist tradition to the history of the life sciences, Canguilhem insists that vitalism, unlike animism, is to be understood as a kind of scientific attitude and not as a metaphysical position. "Si étrange que cette affirmation puisse d'abord paraître, les vitalistes du XVIIIe siècle ne sont pas, commes les vues trop sommaire de beaucoup d'historiens de la biologie ou de la médecine ont tendu à l'accréditer, d'impénitente métaphysiciens mais plutôt de prudents positivistes, ce qui revient à dire, pour l'époque, des newtoniens. Le vitalisme c'est d'abord le réfus simultané de toutes les théories métaphysiques concernant l'essence de la vie. Et c'est pourquoi la plupart des vitalistes se réfèrent explicitement à Newton comme au modèle du savant soucieux d'observations et d'expériences et n'utilisant, dans leur interprétation, que des notions aptes à permettre l'énoncé, sous forme de principes, de faits sinon toujours perçus, du moins touours induits, dont la cause n'est pas recherchée sous forme d'hypothèses. Le vitalisme ce serait simplement la reconnaissance de la vie comme ordre original de phénomèmes et donc de la spécificité de la connaissance biologique" (Canguilhem, La formation du concept de réflexe aux XVIIe et XVIIIe siècles, 2nd ed. (Paris: Vrin, 1977), 113; emphasis added). But the authors in this volume, unlike Canguilhem, seem to understand vitalism primarily as a metaphysical position.

[5] Tomšič quotes from EWA 476/DE II no. 361, 1593. Foucault is there paraphrasing the argument that Canguilhem develops in the mid-1960s in "Le concept et la vie," in Études d'histoire et de philosophie des sciences, 7th ed. (Paris: Vrin, 2002), 335-64 and in the "New Reflections" appended to The Normal and the Pathological (New York: Zone, 1991).

[6] Gaston Bachelard, La psychanalyse du feu (Paris: Gallimard, 1937).

[7] Stéphane Legrand, "Le marxisme oublié de Foucault," Actuel Marx 36.2 (2004): 27-43.

[8] See in particular Laurie Laufer and Amos Squverer, eds., Foucault et la psychanalyse (Paris: Hermann, 2015); Laufer, "Une psychanalyse foucaldienne est-elle possible?" Nouvelle revue de psychosociologie 20 (2015): 233-247; and Jean Allouch, La psychanalyse, une érotologie de passage (Paris: EPEL, 1998). Laufer's argument about the points of convergence between Foucault and Lacan deserves serious consideration.

[9] DE II no. 297, 1016-1017. My translation.

[10] "[Lacan] voulait soustraire la psychanalyse à la proximité, qu'il considérait comme dangereuse, de la médecine et des institutions médicales. Il cherchait en elle non pas un processus de normalisation des comportements, mais une théorie du sujet. C'est pourquoi, malgré une apparence de discours extrêmement spéculatif, sa pensée n'est pas étrangère à tous les efforts qui ont été faits pour remettre en question les pratiques de la médecine mentale" (DE II no. 299, 1023).

[11] Foucault, The Hermeneutics of the Subject: Lectures at the Collège de France, 1981-1982, edited by Frédéric Gros (New York: Picador, 2006), 189.

[12] Lawlor, "The Chiasm and the Fold: An Introduction to the Philosophical Concept of Archaeology," in Thinking through French Philosophy: The Being of the Question (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003), 27-28.