Lack of Character: Personality and Moral Behavior

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Doris, John M., Lack of Character: Personality and Moral Behavior, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 284pp, $60.00, ISBN 0521631165.

Reviewed by Lawrence Blum, University of Massachusetts, Boston


John Doris’s Lack of Character argues against the virtue theoretic trend in contemporary moral theory. Following Owen Flanagan’s pioneering work, Varieties of Moral Personality (1991), Doris draws on the literature of experimental social psychology to make a case that virtue theory and the language of character on which it draws are committed to various unsustainable empirical claims about human behavior. He recommends jettisoning thinking about human behavior and moral capacities in terms of broad traits of character such as “honesty,” bravery,” and “self-reliance.” Lack of Character is engagingly and accessibly written, provocative, non-dogmatic, chock full of interesting arguments. It is a terrific and important contribution to moral theory and moral psychology.

In Chapter 1: Joining the Hunt, Doris appropriately chides moral philosophers for ignoring psychologists ’ explorations of the psychology of moral personhood, even while turning to its own brand of philosophical moral psychology. As moral philosophers turned toward character and virtue, social psychology in the 1960’s and 1970’s was problematizing those very notions. Disciplinary narrowness and a misunderstanding of the autonomy of ethics fed this failure of cross-disciplinary engagement. Doris provides a modest defense of social psychology against challenges to its scientific status and relevance to philosophical moral psychology, but no more than he needs to maintain that it contributes to our understanding of human behavior in a manner pertinent to philosophical moral psychology.

Chapter 2: Character and Consistency sets out Doris’s main contentions. The predictive, descriptive, and explanatory appeal to traits, such as is generally understood as entailed by the notion of “character,” is “confounded by the extraordinary situational sensitivity observed in human behavior” (15). Doris calls the conception of character he opposes “globalist,” involving three features. 1) “Consistency”: to possess a trait involves exhibiting trait-relevant behavior in a wide variety of trait-relevant “eliciting conditions.” (Doris means “appropriately eliciting” rather than “actually eliciting.”) 2) “Stability”: Character and personality traits are reliably manifested by a given agent in trait-relevant behaviors over iterated trials of similar trait-relevant eliciting conditions. (So consistency implies stability, but not vice versa.) “Evaluative integration”: “In a given character or personality the occurrence of a trait with a particular evaluative valence is probabilistically related to the occurrence of other traits with similar evaluative valences.” (The honest person will tend to be compassionate rather than callous.) So globalism construes personality as an evaluatively integrated association of robust traits.

Against globalism, Doris sets his “situationism,” a term derived from social psychology, and associated with the views of Mischel, and Ross and Nisbett, who are referred to frequently in the book. Situationism holds that behavioral differences are due less to individual dispositional differences than to situational ones; that “to a surprising extent,” people behave similarly in similar situations; that people “typically” behave without the consistency required for trait attributions; that evaluatively inconsistent dispositions may cohabit in a single personality. (Despite occasional attempts, Doris provides no satisfactory account of what counts as a “situation.”) Personality structures are fragmented rather than integrated. Doris is not saying that no one possesses a robust trait. He is claiming only that such traits are much rarer both than ordinary discourse appears to imply, than people ordinarily think, and that virtue ethics appears to require.

As the argument progresses, Doris makes it clear that he is not rejecting trait ascription as such, though he sometimes talks as if he does. Rather he is rejecting “robust traits”—the standard fare in virtue ethics—but not “local traits.” So Henry might not be “honest,” full stop, but Doris allows that he might be honest (reliably and consistently) in certain contexts, for example at work, but not in others such as his home life or with his friends. The level or type of localism is not specified. Perhaps the relevant local trait should be even more differentiated—”honest with respect to matters involving financial disclosure,” or “honest with respect to matters bearing on personal ambition.” Doris’s theoretical commitments do not provide any particular reason for expecting dispositional consistency in the domain types he specifies; yet his concession of some forms of dispositional consistency in moral behavior, however undertheorized, is reasonable.

In chapter 3: Moral Character, Moral Behavior, Doris supplies the social-science research that supports situationism—in particular, that morally irrelevant or trivial situational factors have a large impact on morally relevant behavior— against “characterological moral psychology”. Doris focuses on compassion-relevant behavior, or what is generally known in social psychology as “prosocial” or “helping” behavior. In one experiment, 87% of subjects who found a dime in a phone booth helped an experimental confederate who dropped her papers, while only 4% of those who did not find a dime helped. The presence of two confederates who were passive in the face of what could plausibly be seen as an emergency reduced the subjects’ appropriately responsive behavior from 70% to 7%. A third experiment involved students at Princeton Theological Seminary being told they were in a high, low, or medium “hurry” to report for the second part of an experiment. This variable had a large impact on their willingness to help a seemingly distressed person on the path to their destination (10% help for high hurry, 63% for low).

It is indeed troubling that people would be influenced by such morally trivial factors in their choice whether to provide low-cost assistance to others. Doris raises the issue of “ecological validity”—do experimental findings reflect phenomena found in natural contexts. He recognizes that these results are counterintuitive to the way most of us think about morally relevant behavior. But I think he is correct in suggesting that the experimental situations may just highlight situational effects that apply in real life but are often masked by the wider complex of factors in real life contexts.

Doris maintains, moreover, that behavior toward intimates may exhibit a greater consistency than the stranger-related behavior in the experiments. He counts the affective ties as defining a distinct “situation,” as if doing so made such consistency an instance of situationism. This seems confused to me. Why would friendship not be subject to its own forms of (sub)situational variation (mood, hurrying, situational definition issues)? (Doris cites no empirical evidence on this matter.) The unclarity and arbitrariness in what constitutes the “situation” and on which level or in which domain the local traits are envisioned to operate is a weakness in Doris’s argument.

Most telling for the power of situationalism are the results of the Milgram experiments of the early 1960’s. Subjects from different socioeconomic groups and of (subsequently determined) differing personality types were to an alarming degree willing to press a buzzer that had the apparent result of causing a confederate in another room to experience great pain and distress for giving a wrong answer to a test question. When the subjects raise questions about what they are being asked to do, the experimenter applied mild pressure in the form of appealing to the need to complete the experiment. Doris runs through various reassuring explanations of Milgram’s results and criticisms of the experimental methodology, and convincingly finds them all wanting or at best mildly ambiguous. “Whatever compassionate dispositions the subjects had were not especially robust,” he dryly remarks. Yet his overly vague notion of situationalism seems to provide a more salutary, if arbitrary, interpretation; the Milgram subject could see himself as being uncompassionate in situations comparable to those in the experimental situation, without this having any implication about his compassionate behavior in myriad other kinds of situations.

As Doris mentions, some Holocaust scholars (most famously Christopher Browning) have drawn on the Milgram results (and those of Zimbardo as well) in partial explanation of the willingness of middle-aged, non-military German police (the “order police”) to massacre Jews in occupied Poland, when the penalty for refusing to do so was confined to shaming by one’s fellow officers. Studies of Holocaust perpetrators often uncover the kind of personality fragmentation and/or domain specificity of behavior that Doris suggests—murderers by day, good fathers at home; kindness toward prisoners, but willing participation in their murder. A confrontation with the Holocaust seems to me to lend support to situationism with regard to evil—morally average persons can be led to commit terrible actions in certain conditions.

Interestingly, studies of rescuers during the Holocaust lends much less direct support to situationalism; Doris’s discussion on this matter is misleading. It is true, as he notes, that there were large national differences in the degree to which non-Jewish populations assisted Jews; but these differences were often morally quite pertinent rather than trivial—for example, for helping a Jew, a non-Jew would be killed in Poland but not in France or Denmark. The depth of direct Nazi rule, hence the likelihood of being discovered and punished, also differed nationally. Yet among rescuers who were (in contrast to the Danes, or the French village of Le Chambon) not part of communal rescue operations, Samuel and Pearl Oliner find a small number of stable personality types—some showing strong empathy for other human beings in general, others exhibiting a pattern of social commitment and responsibility.1 Doris’s general skepticism about the value of self-report (which he applies to the Oliners’ work) seems unconvincing in this context; the Oliners’ subject were not simply reporting their feelings but their behavior over a fairly substantial stretch of time, and had no particular reason to deceive themselves or their interviewers about their behavior before their rescue activities. Yet, even if they did possess robust traits of compassion or social responsibility, that there were so few rescuers should not pose a problem for Doris’s general skepticism about character. But his failure adequately to distinguish morally relevant from morally irrelevant features of situations may lead him to overstate the absence of robust traits.

Chapter 4: The Fragmentation of Character elaborates Doris’s argument for personality fragmentation by criticizing several trends in personality psychology (Mischel’s Five-Factor model, “Social-Cognitive” theory, and others). Doris emphasizes that his account does not deny consistency in people’s attitudes, goals and values, but only in the behavior that expresses them.

Chapter 5: Judging Character describes experimental evidence that people expect much greater behavioral consistency than in fact obtains. They postulate personal attributes rather than situational factors as explanations of behavior. “Apparently, people are quite put off by personal inconsistency and devote considerable ingenuity to reorganizing incongruent stimuli into an integrated whole” (96). Later Doris notes that this tendency, which he calls “overattribution,” is stronger in Western than Eastern countries.

In chapter 6: From Psychology to Ethics, Doris explores implications of his empirical claims for normative ethics. He is not engaging in a radically revisionist project. Judgments of rightness or wrongness, good and bad action, need not be affected by jettisoning of trait/character language. (Doris does not explore whether virtue language could be retained in application to acts—”a compassionate act.”) If characterological moral psychology is seen as offering a focus of ethical aspiration, it is even empirically possible that virtue talk will provide the best way to induce agents to behave well. (But in chapter 7, Doris argues convincingly that an actual person should not always emulate the actions of an ideally virtuous person, since, given his actual psychology, his attempting to perform such action may have undesirable results.) It might make us queasy to contemplate the moral luck implication that had I been placed in circumstances like those of the German order police, I might have become a murderer; but this does not preclude attributing local traits as a mode of person evaluation. Doris rightly criticizes the current fad of “character education” for its weak empirical base, but acknowledges that appeal to character-based narratives might have a salutary effect in promoting moral behavior and perhaps (though he does not say this) admirable local traits.

In chapter 7: Situation and Responsibility, Doris rejects the in any case quite implausible view (which he finds in Hume) that we are morally responsible only for actions that flow from stable character traits. Even a conventional virtue theorist should not be saddled with the view that all of our attributable actions flow from traits. Some people are neither honest nor dishonest on standard understandings, yet may act honestly. Doris finds troubling for a theory of responsibility the situationist finding that people are generally, or anyway often, unaware of the influences on their behavior. But why not say that whatever those influences are, we know that we should act on consideration X (e.g. that someone in our vicinity is in danger of rape) to perform action Y, and we are capable of being so motivated, so we are morally responsible for doing so or failing to do so? Instead, Doris propounds the implausible view (about which he seems defensive and uncertain) that we are morally responsible only for motives that we would embrace (“identify with,” in Harry Frankfurt’s sense) if subjected to reflective scrutiny. His heroic attempts to show how people would embrace morally bad motives in this sense are unsuccessful, though some genuine moral insight is displayed along the way. Doris provides a helpful discussion of excusing conditions, rightly arguing that excuse can not be dependent on the frequency or commonality of the behavior in question in those circumstances.

Doris draws from situationalism the lesson that our ethical attention should be focused on a kind of “self-manipulation”—avoiding situations in which we may well be influenced to behave badly—rather than attempting a personal transformation in global situation-independent traits. But his rejection of globalism needn’t take him in such a purely consequentialist direction, and one that barely construes the human person as a responsible moral agent. Why, for example, does Doris not talk about the cultivation of local traits—honesty with colleagues, loyalty to friends, compassion to strangers? Moreover, eschewing global traits for concrete actions hardly precludes aiming at good deliberation; indeed, it supports the more concrete focus on action rather than the broader and vaguer one on traits. Recognition of the often unsuspected influences of situations enlarges the scope of what needs to be taken into account in such deliberation (a point Doris emphasizes elsewhere). As occasionally elsewhere in the book, Doris here sets up a dichotomy between situations and traits that omits other determinants of action such as motives, desires, and intentions.

In the final chapter, 8: Is There Anything to Be Ashamed Of, Doris argues, drawing on Conrad’s Lord Jim, that a sense of shame yoked to a globalist conception of a person’s character is (not only premised on a false notion of character but also) morally and personally debilitating. Our focus on self and others can and should recognize lack of personality and character integration, and this fragmentation does not preclude a narrative unity from the inside nor a love for the other as a whole person, taking all her characteristics into account (but not being required to pretend that these form an integrated unity of personality).


1. Samuel and Pearl Oliner, “The Altruistic Personality” in Donald Niewyk (ed.), The Holocaust, 3rd edition (Houghton Mifflin, 2003, p. 228f).